Theories of Action and Morality: Perspectives from Philosophy and Social Theory

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Mark Alznauer and José M. Torralba (eds.), Theories of Action and Morality: Perspectives from Philosophy and Social Theory, Georg Olms, 2016, 217pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783487153872.

Reviewed by Kristina Gehrman, University of Tennessee


Can human action be understood and usefully treated as value-free, or amoral? All of the essays in this collection either presuppose or argue that it cannot: "it is undesirable or even incoherent to treat human agency as if it were conceptually independent of value questions" (7). In itself, this commitment is not unusual in contemporary action theory. The distinctive ambition of this volume is to represent both "philosophic and sociological" perspectives on action thus construed (8), in a way that will be mutually illuminating and intellectually worthwhile to scholars across disciplines.

Of course, for the collection as a whole to realize its cross-disciplinary ambition requires that each author make his or her piece illuminating and intellectually worthwhile across disciplinary boundaries. And while you can lead an analytic philosopher to the edge of the discipline, you can't always make him leap, or even lean. Thus for example Sebastian Rödl's piece on internal and external ends of action, however brilliant it may be, might as well have been written in code with its abundance of technical terms, untranslated Greek, and unelaborated allusions to "the literature". At the other end of the spectrum, however, Dieter Schönecker's "Why There Is No Fact of Reason in the Groundwork" proves that it is possible to do clear, straightforward Kant scholarship that is interesting to the non-specialist, without watering things down. And John Levi Martin's wonderful essay on Kant's aesthetics as a model for historical explanation embodies all that is supposed to be good about cross-disciplinary discourse on themes of shared interest ("Simmel and Rickert on Aesthetics and Historical Explanation"). This analytically trained reader would have found the collection worthwhile for the introduction to Levi Martin's work on action alone.

If the volume's cross-disciplinary accessibility is uneven, the scholarship is possibly more varied. Some of the essays are really exceptionally great, while others fail to meet pretty basic standards of clarity and argumentative structure. I was particularly puzzled by the fact that two of the nine chapters are purely expository (Alejandro N. García Martínez's "The Realist Sociological Approach to Action" and Teresa Enríquez's "Mixed Actions in the Work of Harry Frankfurt"). To be sure, including expository essays is one way to ensure cross-disciplinary intelligibility for the volume as a whole, and perhaps this explains the structure and content of these pieces. But it's natural to wonder whether a reader from any discipline wouldn't be better off simply picking up the primary texts these essays discuss. Neither expository chapter has sufficiently broad scope to qualify as a literature review (a genre of writing which would be very useful in a volume such as this one). Still, I believe these essays are best approached in the spirit of the lit review.

Enríquez gives an "overview" of Frankfurt's theory of action, with a focus on his treatment of what Aristotle called "mixed" actions. As the author says, "no particular thesis is advanced" by her discussion (207), and those who are familiar with Frankfurt's collection of essays The Importance of What We Care About (Cambridge University Press, 1998) will not learn anything new from Enríquez's piece. The essay would be most helpful, I think, to someone who wanted to know where to look in Frankfurt's work for his treatment of certain problematic or complicated types of action. García Martínez's contribution is also an avowedly expository introduction to the "realist" social action theories of Margaret Archer and Pierpaolo Donati. Although it was distracting and irritating that the author used "man" and "mankind" throughout the paper to refer to humans and humankind, I learned a good deal of interest about the work of Archer and Donati from García Martínez's account. Philosophers interested in moral responsibility and structural injustice may find this introduction to realist theories especially interesting. But though I appreciated the introduction to these views and the thinkers who espouse them, I found the passages excerpted from both Archer and Donati to be readily understandable in themselves. Again I was left wanting more from the author himself.

In "Contrasting Concepts of Agency and the Space of Reasons", Terry Pinkard proposes an alternative to the standard, "stoic" picture of the space of reasons as "eternal and unchanging", by giving a reading of Hegel's own views on the subject according to which Hegel sees the broader structures and possibilities of rational agency as themselves developing or "dynamic" (32-3). This conception of the space of reasons, on Pinkard's reading of Hegel, explains the sense in which rational norms both transcend and are a function of the human (social) form of life. It thus accommodates the social contingency of rationality without "despairing" of its objectivity (33). Pinkard's Hegelian middle ground between "stoic" and "despairing" conceptions of rational agency can be usefully compared to García Martínez's discussion of Archer's "morphogenic" conception of social agency (151).

Rödl's "Acting as the Internal End of Acting" distinguishes between "internal" and "external" ends of action and argues that the former is more fundamental than, and logically prior to, the latter. Intuitively, the end of an action is that for the sake of which the action is done. But there are two different relations that can obtain between actions and the ends for the sake of which they are performed. Thus if the end of turning the key is to start the car, I have attained my end when the car starts and I am done turning the key. Here, starting the car is an end which is external to the act which I do for its sake. In contrast, if the end of giving someone a hug is to be kind, then the activity and the end are one and the same (they are the kindness). Here the end is internal to the activity. Rödl's analysis, if successful, accomplishes two things: it explains how an end can cause an action by explaining what is confused about the question: how can something that doesn't exist yet cause the thing which causes it to exist? And it solves the "deontological paradox", explaining how it can be rational to act in accordance with a maxim, by classifying this sort of action as action for the sake of an internal end.

Schönecker's "Why There Is No Fact of Reason in the Groundwork" left me with a warm, friendly feeling that interpretive arguments about Kant's ethics do not usually impart. The objective of the paper is to argue, "in a clear and unambiguous fashion", that Kant does not claim that there is a fact of pure practical reason in the Groundwork; rather, this thesis appears for the first time in the Critique of Practical Reason (55). And the paper succeeds admirably in its aims, making it very clear both what the author is saying, and why, and why we should care.

Schönecker begins by recapitulating his previously published reading of Kant's thesis of "the fact of reason": "we know and recognize the validity of the moral law 'immediately' and in a way that is 'undeniable'" (62); we do this with "an immediately given feeling" of respect for the moral law (59). He then presents three distinct arguments in support of the claim that this thesis is not present in the Groundwork: the "phantom argument," the "subjection argument", and the "confirmation argument". Each of these arguments depends in some way on pointing out that in the Groundwork Kant raises questions or entertains doubts or possibilities that are (Schönecker argues) incompatible with Kant's simultaneously asserting the fact of reason.

It's hard to say in a phrase what the reader is meant to take away from Ana Marta Gonzalez's discussion of Weber, Aristotle, Kant and Hume on action ("The Recovery of Action in Social Theory"). Gonzalez begins with Colin Campbell's 1996 criticism of social action theory: that it treats social action as basic, with the result that it cannot give a cogent account of individual agency. Campbell's criticism is assumed as a starting point, and one objective of the essay is to discuss the resources available in the work of Aristotle, Kant and Hume for restoring a basic notion of individual agency (or "subjectivity") to social action theory. The second section of the paper is accordingly devoted to a general discussion of themes in the action theory and ethics of these philosophers. Section 3 introduces Weber's "typology of action" (which can retrospectively be seen to have organized the content of section 2), and raises some criticisms of that typology. The main criticism seems to be that Weber treated his typology as cleanly disjunctive (actions are either instrumentally rational or affectual or "value rational", etc. (99), but never some more complicated combination). If so then, Gonzalez suggests, we can draw on themes from Aristotle, Kant, and Hume to complicate Weber's picture in a more satisfying and plausible way, thus helping social action theory towards a more robust conception of the individual agent's contribution to action.

In "Simmel and Rickert on Aesthetics and Historical Explanation", John Levi Martin articulates a compelling conception of "social knowledge" as distinctively second-personal (143). Through a discussion of the influence of Kant (for better and for worse) on the sociological and historical theory of Georg Simmel and Heinrich Rickert, Martin moves gradually to the suggestion that historical and sociological knowledge requires the kind of intimate personal understanding that is best understood in terms of love. In the process, his discussion inspires reflection on the nature of the a priori, the objectivity of ethics, and the intrinsically ethical nature of historical understanding -- all in a way that is transparent and accessible even to a reader not already familiar with the canon that is being discussed. There are interesting connections to be found to the work of Iris Murdoch, and the essay may usefully be read in conjunction with Evgenia Mylonaki's contribution (see below).

Sophie Djigo's "Leverage and Truth" discusses the fact, anguishing to the conscientious, that people are not always overridingly motivated to do what they know they ought (morally) to do. She begins by recounting Augustine's struggles on this front, and moves on to discuss Bernard Williams's reasons internalism, before concluding in the latter half of the paper that agents must avow the moral truth in order for it to have the proper "leverage" (or motivational force). It is not clear what the discussion of reasons internalism contributes to the overall aim of the essay, since Djigo assumes reasons externalism at the start of section 3 and then shifts gears to talk about a different contrast (between first- and third-personal perspectives on moral truth). In the end the reader is left wondering how it helps Augustine to know that what he must do to overcome his weak ("half-wounded") will is to avow the moral truth (175, 201). After all, is not the relevant question still how avowal is to be accomplished with a "half-wounded" will?

Finally, the highly contestable premise of Mylonaki's paper ("Practical Knowledge and Perception") is that "knowledge of what one ought to do falls . . . under the genus of practical knowledge" as the latter is construed by Anscombe (250). If this were true, then one could know what one ought to do without observation. This seems not only dubious on its face, but also emphatically un-Aristotelian, given that Aristotle says that we understand what to do by means of a kind of perception (see Nicomachean Ethics 1142a22-30). Thus there's a "tension" between, on the one hand, the idea that knowledge of what one ought to do is a kind of Anscombian practical knowledge, and, on the other, Murdoch's distinctively Aristotelian conception of moral understanding as a form of outward-directed moral perception. (It seems odd to call this a "tension"; why should Murdoch accept Anscombe's view of action or practical knowledge?) But setting that rhetorical quibble aside, Mylonaki's solution to the "tension" is a lovely account of the sense in which doing what one ought to do constitutively involves knowing, "without observation", that the thing one does is (among other things) that which one ought to be doing. Thus, for example, regarding the case of responding with sensitivity to a friend's perceived vulnerability, Mylonaki explains that "if the agent didn't know of [her friend's] vulnerability that it was what she ought to do something about, then in the circumstances the agent wouldn't be thinking or doing what she ought to in whatever it was that she was thinking or doing" (264).

I doubt that this chapter will be readily understandable to someone who is not fairly familiar with the work of both Murdoch and Anscombe. One can hardly expect a critical discussion of anything Anscombe says to be transparent to readers who are not already braced for it. But Mylonaki writes in a clear and tightly organized way, makes excellent use of illustrations, and has an abundantly populated bibliography, so that I think it's fair to say the essay is accessible to the extent permitted by her subject matter. The text reads like the thin edge of a project-shaped wedge, and anyone interested in neo-Aristotelian ethics and action theory, especially in Murdoch's notion of moral perception, should look forward to further installments from this author.

On the whole, then, although the cross-disciplinary ambition of the collection is at best only partly realized, arguably even this mixed result is a real success, and makes a substantive and much-needed contribution to action theory. It's not easy to produce scholarship that is both cross-canonically accessible and rigorous. While not all of the chapters in this volume succeed in this regard, enough of them do so to prove the point of further conversations between analytic philosophy of action and social theory of action in a broadly Weberian tradition.