There is: The Event and the Finitude of Appearing

Placeholder book cover

Claude Romano, There is: The Event and the Finitude of Appearing, Michael B. Smith (tr.), Fordham University Press, 2015, 271pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823267156.

Reviewed by Pierre-Jean Renaudie, University of Porto


This is the third volume (originally published in French as Il y a, 2003) in Claude Romano's 'evential hermeneutics' project. It evolved from Event and World (2009; L’événement et le monde, 1998) and Event and Time (2014; L’événement et le temps, 1999).  This third volume laid the groundwork for Romano's major work,  At the Heart of Reason (2015; Au cœur de la raison, la phénoménologie, 2010). In that later work, Romano developed an in-depth confrontation between phenomenology and its analytic criticisms, and he argued for the legitimacy of a renewal of phenomenology that addresses some of the main challenges of contemporary thought. With the translation of these four books, English speakers have access to the core of Romano's philosophical thought and can grasp what is at stake in his intellectual journey.

Why an 'evenential hermeneutics'? What are its purpose and its tasks? Romano's philosophical project (introduced in Event and Time and Event and World) analyses the impact of fundamental events on a person's existence. These events contribute to configuring the meaning of the world within which her decisions, actions, understanding of herself, and more generally her life, takes place. This project is phenomenological insofar as it aims at analysing the conditions of the appearing of such events. It draws on the main figures of the phenomenological tradition (Husserl and Heidegger first and foremost, but also their French inheritors: Merleau-Ponty, Sartre, Ricœur, Maldiney, and Levinas) in order to unveil the temporal structures and bring out the existential meaning that the "coming about" of the event involves.

An 'event', Romano claims, "upsets the hierarchy of the agent's objectives, the configuration of his possibilities, the way in which he understands them, and himself in light of them, that is, his world as such" (15). This aspect of the event entails that its phenomenological description requires a hermeneutics, because this notion of the event always involves the possibility of understanding the meaning of one's existence. Events always carry the tragic weight of a crisis through which "the possibility of understanding himself is opened to man" (4). In contrast to mere facts, which are fundamentally subject to a causal inquiry and somehow reducible to the causes they follow from, events belong to the domain of meaning, "that is, to a domain in which the understanding of a situation by an agent comes into play" (12-13). Events do not only happen. Their "coming about" is essentially characterized by their significant impact on the human lives that they affect and transform. Events necessarily carry a certain meaning that is to be revealed in light of the possibilities of existence they contribute in reconfiguring.

A fundamental feature of this reconfiguration is, according to Romano, its "impersonal" character (60). While events always befall someone, they nevertheless appear as anonymous insofar as they affect one's existence from the outside, dismissing one's ability to anticipate and control the actualization of the event. Events happen to us, so to speak, without us; they reconfigure our possibilities and determine our place within the world beyond our reach. The radical change that the occurrence of the event provokes is primarily a "transformation of the world" (XVI). Being impersonal, this "reconfiguration of the world" urges us to reconsider the role that we are able to play with respect to the constitution and determination of the meaning of our own existence. This is the reason why evential hermeneutics is bound to criticize and eventually reject any form of transcendental philosophy that substitutes, explicitly or not, an analysis of the a priori conditions of the experience of the world for a proper description of the irreducible novelty of the event. Evential hermeneutics is then expected to provide a phenomenological description of the "absolute change" that arises from the event's critical upheaval. It is this "'passage' from nothing to something", this "occurrence out of the blue" (XVII) irreducible to any kind of causal mechanism, that Romano proposes to call "there is".

The overall purpose of the evential hermeneutics put forward in this third book is to open a pathway for a new and revised phenomenology that resists the transcendental temptation to which Heidegger and his French inheritors yielded, according to Romano, no less than Husserl. Accounting for the impersonal character of the events that play a fundamental role in the determination of our possibilities of existence keeps us away from any philosophical method that aims at tracing the process of appearing back to its constituting sources in a "subject", or in a Dasein whose transcendence is expected to provide the conditions of possibility of the appearing of the world. Heidegger, according to this reading, "transforms Husserlian transcendentalism from within without breaking away from it entirely" (XII). Romano's non-transcendental phenomenology of the event is meant to take on the project that Heidegger was aiming at but failed to carry through with. It is a phenomenology that puts forward an "evential conception of existence" (59) which does not need to ground the appearing of the world and the constitution of its meaning in anything but the actual "coming about" of the events that disclose the world to us and give our existence its singular meaning. The goal of such a phenomenology of the event is "to understand how it transforms that situation, that experience, that history; how it appears irreducible to all prior understanding and is itself the opener and initiator of its own meaning" (XVII-XVIII).

Romano doesn't focus on the event's impact on the structures of existence as such as he did in his previous two books. Instead, taking a new direction, he attempts to describe "the very appearing of the event", its occurring or its coming about, provided that the transformation performed by this "coming about" has nothing in common with the changes undergone by things that remain through time. This direction, moreover, is absolutely critical and decisive not only for Romano's evential hermeneutics, but also for phenomenology: "the question of the there-is is the very question of the appearing as it is posed to any phenomenology" (XVII). One of the most remarkable achievements of this book is to propose a series of phenomenologically-based studies faithful to the spirit of the tradition in its approach to existence, while deeply revising and pointing out its shortcomings. Romano addresses three fundamental challenges that contemporary phenomenology must face by: a) proposing a constructive criticism of transcendentalism, b) arguing that phenomenology is able to specify the meaning of the logos of phenomena without having to meet the exclusive requirements that contemporary logic imposes on it, and c) revitalizimg the question of the delimitation of metaphysics that was cast aside by the main representatives of contemporary hermeneutics in the 20th century (Gadamer, Ricœur, Taylor, etc.).

These three issues intertwine throughout the three parts of the book and command its structure. The three chapters of the first section, "Event and Metaphysics", attempt to delimit the metaphysical horizon of the evential hermeneutics through a critical but meticulous reading of Aristotle's conception of tukhè (a necessary chance that matches Romano's notion of the event), a critique of Heidegger's oblivion of the event, and an analysis of Bergson's investigations on the temporality of possibility. The second section, "Beyond Subject and Object?", attempts to revise from within the phenomenological analysis of three main concepts (freedom, flesh and perception) each of which played a fundamental role in the development of the phenomenological tradition. In three chapters dedicated respectively to the Sartrean concept of freedom, to Husserl's analysis of the flesh and its critical uptake by Merleau-Ponty, and to J. J. Gibson's ecological phenomenology, Romano tries to demonstrate the phenomenological necessity of overcoming the transcendental modes of reasoning about the world and to open new pathways towards a non-transcendental and nevertheless phenomenological description of its disclosure.

Finally, the book's last part consists of two chapters that scrutinize the phenomenological meaning of the concepts that constitute the basis of the evential hermeneutics (existence, nothingness and event), arguing for their irreducibility to the logical function that logical analysis ascribes to these concepts. Romano discusses Carnap's project to eliminate metaphysics through a logical paraphrasing and rejection of the existential concept of nothingness emphasized by Heidegger. Examining the roots of this project in Frege and Russell, Romano points out the shortcomings of their logical analysis of the notion of existence, and argues that it entails an irreducible metaphysical claim, which presupposes the "perfect univocity of existence" (202).

Against such a generalization of the logical concept of existence, Romano contends that the phenomenological distinction between the different regional ontologies allows us to conceive a radically alternate and irreducible mode of existing that involves a non-logical but nevertheless rigorous concept of nothingness, crucial to his own philosophical undertaking. In the last chapter, Romano explores the implications of this phenomenological concept of nothingness. He claims that the apparent logical contradictions inherently attached to the notion of the event put forward by evential hermeneutics find a phenomenological legitimacy in the context of its "occurring" provided that we take into consideration its specific "modality of appearing": "the event is nothing other than its pure appearing qua appearing out of the nothing, in the forefront of the nothing, in suspense in the nothing" (223). One regrets the absence of the French version's seventh chapter in this translation, since it provides more detailed insights on the specific temporality of the event. However, its absence does not affect the book's intelligibility or weaken its structure.

Although the eight studies gathered in There is span a very wide spectrum of topics and address some of the most difficult problems inherited from the phenomenological tradition, Romano does an admirable job in making these crucial points explicit and intelligible. The book is a particularly easy and pleasant read regardless of the difficulties inherent to the topics discussed. The book could possibly be criticised for the relative absence of references to the most recent studies on the philosophical issues it addresses. However, this lack of references accords with the writing style, which contributes greatly to make reading it more fluid and accessible, and allows Romano to open a personal and original pathway with respect to fundamental questions in philosophy. This remarkable attempt to improve our understanding of major issues like the relation between existence and temporality, the contentious relationship between phenomenology and logic, and the intrinsic connection between metaphysics and hermeneutics, legitimates the author's choice to focus on the major historical figures and on the most significant contributions on these matters. Romano's rigorous analyses developed throughout the book draw out a particularly clear, insightful and interesting reading of the main philosophers belonging to the phenomenological tradition.

For reasons of space, I will not be able to present in detail these analyses nor do justice to their subtlety. I shall need to limit myself to raising a few questions about the philosophical stakes of the evential hermeneutics sketched in There Is. A particularly fascinating aspect of Romano's project is its complex and ambiguous relation to Heidegger's ontology. In his last tribute to Levinas, Derrida described his relation to Husserl as a kind of paradoxical unfaithful fidelity -- "infidèle fidélité". This analysis perfectly fits Romano's ambiguous relation to the author of Being and Time and could be applied to his critical but respectful reading of Heidegger, whose influence on his work is constant and unquestionable. The 'evential hermeneutics' is to be understood as a response to the Heideggerian project of an 'existential analytics', a response that identifies and attempts to address its major deficiency, i.e., the lack of an existential analysis of the event that studies the conditions under which something can happen to Dasein that transforms it in a significant and meaningful way.

According to Romano, Heidegger dismisses too quickly the existential significance of the event and its impact on the "ek-sistence" of Dasein. "The event, as soon as it comes up in Sein und Zeit, is traced back to an inauthentic modality of Dasein, that is to an ontological dissimulation of its existence" (17-18). Romano very convincingly demonstrates that this "surreptitious reduction of events to mere innerworldly facts" that can receive only the ontological meaning of Vorhandenheit (50) misses a fundamental dimension of existence and is responsible for Heidegger's unsatisfying analysis of the "ecstatic" temporality of Dasein. The very question that Being and Time unearths and emphasizes, the question about the "who?" that characterizes the Sein of Dasein, requires an in-depth analysis of the occurrence of the events that determine the very possibilities of Dasein and contribute in reconfiguring its world, making each time that Dasein the particular Dasein it is and has to be. "It is the event, understood more radically in its relation to possibility, that, by its very upsurge, reconfigures all my possibilities before any project of mine and is world-forming for the "entity" that I am" (51). Dasein, in other words, if we need to take into consideration its evential structure and understand it as an "advenant" -- a being affected in its understanding of itself by the events that occur to it -- cannot be authentic in the sense that Heidegger gives to this word. Its own possibilities are not completely under its control or in its power: "the advenant is exposed to possibilities of which he is not the measure" (225). This is why the fundamental "evential" -- that Romano opposes to the "existentiales" listed and analysed in Heidegger's Being and Time -- lays the ground of the advenant's existence and is its "passibility" (59, 225). Dasein's freedom is not enough to allow him to project and configure a world of possibilities only based on its resolute project toward death. "Here, 'possibilities' are no longer what is open by the free projection of a finite potentiality-for-Being, but what comes to me without coming from me in the ordeal undergone through the event" (52-53).

Logically, the analysis of the hermeneutical status of birth becomes the leading thread of this phenomenology of the event. The demonstration of the antecedence and priority over the free projection of Dasein's possibilities focuses primarily on the existential role of birth, insofar as birth is to be described as an event that necessarily marks one's existence and impacts its meaning although it can by no means be fully taken over: "one is born into oneself without ever being able to take one's own birth upon oneself" (47). Being immemorial, birth cannot but be inauthentic according to Being and Time's concepts, as it opens existence to a past that cannot be subject to appropriation nor be projected as one's possibilities. Birth becomes the event "par excellence" (64) revealing the limits of my ability to take responsibility for the whole of my existence and undermining the privilege of Selfhood. "Selfhood, as an ontological structure, can no longer be considered originary" (64). It is needless to add that this analysis entails a complete dismantling and revision of Heidegger's existential analytics. If, as Romano claims, birth is not a mere fact about one's life and does not belong to the innerworldly domain of the states of affairs having the ontological characteristic of Vorhandenheit, then we need to acknowledge that the question of Being goes well beyond Dasein's own potentiality-for-Being and surpasses its power of appropriation. Being is entrusted to Dasein before all ownership of its existence or authenticity as a gift "that it can neither appropriate nor understand but that irrupts into its most intimate existence" (48).

This remarkable analysis of birth raises a conceptual difficulty and a more general concern regarding the overall project it supports. The conception of the event that Romano's analyses put forward characterizes it as fundamentally non-worldly and "unexperienceable" (60). The exceptional character of events does not fit the standards of the empirical concept of experience, which reduces the event to a mere "experience-of-facts" according to Romano's distinction between events and facts. Insofar as events contribute to reconfiguring our world and deeply altering our understanding of ourselves, they impose their own temporality on our existence and cannot be said to come about in a world that pre-exists their occurrence. This argument may be convincing when applied to very specific and extraordinary moments that disrupt the flow of our existence and upset the meaning of our world at a very deep level. But it seems quite counter-intuitive to apply this analysis to the particular case of birth -- and more generally to the common events that necessarily belong to the history of everyone's life -- as birth does.

 On the contrary it seems that precisely because of its "unexperienceability", birth hardly plays any role in the determination of one's possibilities of existence and cannot affect the meaning of one's life. A birth is certainly -- or at least can be -- an event in the strongest sense of the word: disruptive, life-changing, and likely to affect the meaning of one's existence. But for whom? Less so for the child who cannot experience it and whose birth belongs to the domain of the facts that provide a strictly extrinsic determination of her identity than for her parents. "Born on the 19th of November 1979": Romano would concur that such a mere fact about the identity of Pierre-Jean Renaudie cannot provide me with any meaning that could help me understand who I am and what is the extent of my possibilities of existence. But can my birth be anything more than a mere fact, as long as it is not part of my experience? Yet, this fact mentioned on my identity card may very well refer to a proper event, but an event that marked and transformed my parents' lives rather than mine. If birth is an event, it is an event for the others who experienced it in a significant and disruptive fashion, rather than for myself. How could the event possess the "dimension of referentiality and of address" according to which "it is always an event for someone" (15) if this event is not to be experienced in a concrete and straightforward way, likely to effectively impact my life and affect the meaning of my existence? In order to possess such a strong power over my life, the event needs to occur primarily as an empirical and worldly fact that can be recognized by everyone before it takes a particular and exclusive significance with respect to my existence.

The conceptual problem that I am trying to raise does not only concern the difficulty of maintaining a clear-cut distinction between events and facts when it comes to birth, it also challenges the meaning of a phenomenology of the "unexperienceable". Since its beginning, phenomenology has always emphasized the necessity of widening the empirical concept of experience in order to avoid the metaphysical presuppositions attached to it. But the very idea of opening the phenomenological description to the realm of the unexperienceable seems to bring the phenomenological concept of experience to its extreme limit and challenges our ability to make sense of its boundaries. Although we might easily grant that some contingent facts can bear some consequences on the conditions of the existence of a person who did not positively experience them, it seems much more difficult to see how unexperienceable events can involve a profound transformation of the selfhood of the one to whom it happens, as Romano claims (15). As interesting and fruitful as this revision of Heidegger's existential analytic is, Romano's evential hermeneutics seems to put phenomenology in an uncomfortable situation, since it urges focusing primarily on events that are not to be experienced in the most common sense of the word and that are by no means fit for the description of the everyday vicissitudes that characterize one's life. According to this approach, events are by definition rare and exceptional: their uniqueness (or singularity) is the condition of their ability to provoke a reconfiguration of my existential possibilities. If so, then how can the analysis of exceptional moments in my life be generalized in order to provide the hermeneutic paradigm for the interpretation of existence? The evential hermeneutics makes the analysis of an exceptional and unexperienceable event the guiding norm for the interpretation of existence. Even if we grant that Romano's strong and original analyses of the notion of event are perfectly legitimated with respect to the specific and restricted field of phenomena that his definition of the event encompasses, the local relevance of these analyses may not justify the kind of generalisation upon which evential hermeneutics is grounded.

Finally, might this emphasis on the unexperienceability of the event, grounded on the rejection of the empirical concept of experience, weaken Romano's attempt to get rid of transcendentalism. By refusing to characterise events as empirical facts or Weltereignisse, evential hermeneutics withdraws these events from the world that they precede and are expected to give rise to. If There is focuses on the appearing of the event as such, it is only insofar as this appearing has nothing to do with the common sense in which something can be said to happen. It seems then difficult not to understand evential hermeneutics as making the event a condition of possibility of the appearing of the world. Romano argues against this objection in several passages, claiming that "the event is not first possible and then actual", and that its emergence "is not subordinate to prior conditions of possibility in the subject" (59). However, his attempt to stress the non-worldly and unexperienceable dimension of the appearing of the event gives rise to a tension that indicates the difficulty of breaking away from the transcendental tendency inherent to phenomenology, even after the dismantling of the Ego.

The difficult challenge that Romano's book faces consists in maintaining the legitimacy of the phenomenological approach -- even after its hermeneutical mutation -- while aiming to revise it in depth from within. Consequently, his evential hermeneutics sometimes seems trapped in a conceptual framework that might not be able to support the radical transformations entailed by such a rethinking of the event. Romano's analyses provide very strong and convincing evidence that this revised conception of the event deserves a place in the existential analytics that Heidegger was aiming at and should have been fully acknowledged by him. But it is not entirely clear whether his efforts to revise the major concepts inherited from the phenomenological tradition (such as the concepts of existence, experience, world, possibilities, nothingness, appearing, etc.) maintain ultimately the evential hermeneutics under the insuperable horizon of Heidegger's existential analytics, or lead it to break through the boundaries of phenomenological thought in order to think outside of its framework. Here we arrive at the essential ambiguity of the relation that ties Romano's philosophical project to Being and Time: that the accomplishment of this remarkable evential hermeneutics might be either too Heideggerian or not Heideggerian enough. It is at the same time too successful in its transformation of Heidegger's conceptual apparatus, and too respectful when overcoming its shortcomings.

Far from undermining the intrinsic qualities of these fascinating and insightful analyses developed in There is, my questions are intended to highlight the depth and interest of the philosophical views that Romano presents. They should by no means diminish the value of a philosophical project that attempts to face the fundamental challenges that need to be addressed by contemporary phenomenology, and which builds an original and extremely stimulating pathway in order to redefine the stakes and outcomes of the phenomenological heritage.