Thine Own Self: Individuality in Edith Stein's Later Writings

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Sarah Borden Sharkey, Thine Own Self: Individuality in Edith Stein's Later Writings, Catholic University of America Press, 2010, 254pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780813216829.

Reviewed by Dermot Moran, University College Dublin


This is a clearly written, detailed, fine scholarly study of Edith Stein's attempt in her later work, especially Finite and Eternal Being, to develop a consistent metaphysics of individuality, offering a modern version of what the medieval scholastic Duns Scotus had tried to do with his notion of haecceitas (literally: 'thisness'). Edith Stein maintains that human beings not only participate in the universal form of humanness but also that each possesses an individual form which has its own distinct intelligibility. The two forms (universal and individual) are not co-present as independent parts but seamlessly unite to produce the single substantial form with its unique essence. Each person (e.g. Socrates) has an essence (what it is to be Socrates) and this is what Stein calls 'individual form' (individuelles Wesen).

Furthermore, Stein believes, the individual as such must be recognized as intelligible precisely as an individual and not just as a member of the species 'human'. This intelligibility of the individual goes against traditional views (from Plato and Aristotle through Aquinas) according to which what is intelligible for humans is the universal. To defend her view a radical modification of the traditional Thomistic account (that places intelligibility in the formal and universal and individuation in the material) is required, and this is what Stein sets out to do in her magnum opus Finite and Eternal Being (completed in 1936 but published posthumously in 1950).[1] Indeed, Finite and Eternal Being is Stein's most ambitious and difficult work, a sprawling ontological meditation on existence, essence and being, which was a reworking of her earlier Potency and Act,[2] a work that she had proposed in 1930 for her Habilitationsschrift in her second unsuccessful attempt to gain that German university teaching qualification.

Borden Sharkey's new study is primarily expository of Stein's ontological discussions and succeeds very well in clarifying Stein's notions of individual form, essential being, and whatness (quiddity), in relation to the more familiar accounts in Aristotle, Aquinas, Scotus and others. This is careful exegesis. For example, Borden Sharkey is alert to the terminological ambiguities and inconsistencies in Stein's writing and even provides a helpful glossary of Stein's technical terms. Stein -- in part following Husserl and Heidegger -- uses several variants of 'essence' (Wesen), including Wesenwas, Wesenheit, Einzelwesen, individuelles Wesen, as well as speaking of 'whatness' (Washeit), and other terms (e.g. Selbstand, subsistence) to distinguish different dimensions of essentiality and quiddity. Stein, for instance, recognizes that to be an individual is itself a form. There is an essence of individuality -- a common character individual things must necessarily have in order to be individuals. But aside from this formal essence, as it were, there is also the unique individual character of the individual -- what makes it this particular and not just a particular. She struggles to articulate this insight especially in Finite and Eternal Being Chapter Eight, entitled 'The Meaning and Foundation of Individual Being'.

Borden Sharkey critically engages with Stein's attempts to articulate the form of the individual. In the end she finds Stein's account of human individuality to be closer to Aquinas' account of angelic individuality (whereby each angel instantiates its own type and there are different types of angels, as expressed in the angelic hierarchy) rather than to the Thomist position on human individuality. For Aristotle and Aquinas, form is the principle of commonality (and intelligibility -- since understanding is of the common or universal) and matter the principle of individuality. Humans are identical in terms of their humanness but differ in terms of their accidental qualities. This does not seem to safeguard the true individual identity of humans. Stein criticizes Aristotle and the medievals for making matter to be the principle of individuation. Matter does not have this power. Form is what individualizes. Humanity is a universal essence, which all humans share by virtue of being human (FEB, p. 470) but there must also be an individual essence, what makes me the unique person I am, what gives me enduring identity.

As is well known, Stein, following a night reading St Theresa of Avila in the home of Hedwig Conrad-Martius, converted to Catholicism in January, 1922, and thereafter (to leave aside completely her personal journey into the convent) began to read herself into Thomistic philosophy, even translating Aquinas' De Veritate. Thus, for the Festschrift commemorating Husserl's seventieth birthday in 1929, she submitted an essay which was essentially a dialogue between Husserl and Aquinas: 'An Attempt to Contrast Husserl's Phenomenology and the Philosophy of St. Thomas Aquinas'. The original draft had been written in the form of a dialogue between these two thinkers: 'What is Philosophy? A Conversation between Edmund Husserl and Thomas Aquinas'.[3] Here she presents the common link as Brentano. Husserl and Aquinas both sought philosophy as rigorous science, 'the serious, sober inquiry of reason'. Aquinas recognizes the limits of human reason (natural reason) but also recognizes the domain of what is absolutely true independent of human subjectivity, a domain Husserl's transcendental phenomenology (which remains fixed in the domain of a world constituted by subjectivity) cannot reach. Both Aquinas and Husserl were interested in the 'analysis of essences' (Wesensanalyse). But Thomas' distinction between existence and essence allows for him to think of the world as created.

Most commentators on Stein over the years have sided either with Stein's Husserlian or with her Thomist meditations, and few like her attempts to develop a dialogue -- even a synthesis -- between these two figures. Moreover, Stein was not a Thomist in the usual sense. She was not a participant in the then burgeoning Neo-Thomist movement in Europe, although she was deeply influenced by her contemporary, the German Jesuit theologian and Augustine scholar Erich Przywara (1889-1972), who was a personal friend of Husserl's and with whom Stein was in correspondence between 1925 and 1931. Przywara's Analogia Entis[4] (1932) was deeply influential for her Finite and Eternal Being (hereafter 'FEB'; see especially, pp. xxix-xxxi, where she records her debt to Przywara). As Borden Sharkey notes, Stein was trained in phenomenology (and was Husserl's assistant from 1916 to 1918) and was particularly interested in the justification of the human sciences, especially psychology in its relation to the unique human individual.

Stein never leaves behind her phenomenology; indeed, she continues to discuss the manner in which it can relate to metaphysics or ontology in Finite and Eternal Being. Stein, following Husserl and Scheler, wanted to develop both a phenomenology and an ontology of the person as a unique individual and as a substance. In a certain sense, she was an existentialist who valued the unique and original in human existence, but she moved more in the direction of ontology influenced both by her close association with the Munich realist school of phenomenologists, especially Hedwig Conrad-Martius (and Jean Hering who wrote an influential article on essence)[5], as well as with Martin Heidegger, whom she knew quite well from her time in Freiburg. In her Author's Preface (written in September 1936) to Finite and Eternal Being, she acknowledges the importance of Heidegger's philosophy of existence as she found it in Being and Time, as well as Hedwig Conrad-Martius' ontology. Indeed, Stein acknowledges certain 'reminiscences' of Heidegger in her own study. Stein commends Heidegger's move to study Being itself and not just beings as such but disagrees with Heidegger's location of the understanding of Being solely in relation to human projection. 'Metaphysics is concerned with beings as such and not with human being alone', she writes (FEB, p. 551). Heidegger, for her, has made the mistake of placing all his emphasis on the finite human Seinsverständnis whereas the understanding of Being cannot be a 'property of finitude'. The finite needs to be measured against an infinite understanding. Stein herself follows Conrad-Martius in thinking that finite being implies infinite being.

Furthermore, Stein, in returning to Thomas, is not being an antiquarian. Under the influence of Husserl and Przywara, she wanted to develop an ontology that is sensitive to the complexity of human consciousness as, to put it in Heideggerean terms which she does not use, the site where being is revealed. In fact, Stein begins from the more Husserlian point of view, beginning with Descartes' discovery of the ego cogito as a recognition of the fact of one's own existence as a conscious subject. In other words, all inquiry must begin from the 'life of ego' (Ichleben, FEB, p. 36). As Stein puts it, my certitude about my own existence is the most primordial, intimate and immediate self-experience I can have (FEB, p. 36).

For Stein this is consistent with Aristotle, since, following Aristotle, she thinks of the living organism as the model for understanding substance. For her, the living human has a form which itself is living and progressive: 'the being of the form is life' (FEB, p. 268). There is no end to personal formation: 'the living being is never finished' (FEB, p. 270). Form or essence, then, has to be conceived of as living, evolving, developing, dynamic -- act in the genuine sense of agency -- rather than as a static constitutive principle, conceived of as a Platonic form or some kind of unfinished structure or blueprint that simply needs to be completed by matter.

Stein, then, proposes to think of individual essence in an original and challenging manner. Stein distinguishes, for instance, between the universal essence of soul (what anything must have in order to qualify as being a soul) and the specific nature or 'personal particularity' of a soul (also called the soul's essence, see FEB, p. 432). Personal essence can be changed radically (as in the case of genuine remorse) and yet there must be a deep continuing identity. There is -- and here the influence of St Theresa of Avila is evident -- something like an interior 'castle of the soul' (FEB, p. 435). Stein recognises that most individuals never reach this depth of soul nor do they live 'collected lives' (inspired here by Heidegger). Yet, all spiritual teachings recognise the need to enter into this inner life and to recognise its depth. Stein's meditations on individual being and personhood weave around these themes. Given this complex background, as well as the tragic manner in which Stein's work was disrupted due to her persecution and death at the hands of the Nazis, it is difficult to form an overall sense of Stein's project.

Borden Sharkey does an excellent job of articulating Stein's basic intent to develop an account of human existence that recognized its common form (animal rationale) and also the uniqueness of each individual, situated, historical existence as a person. The person, moreover, is not just a mereological sum of parts but has a distinct individuality, identity and wholeness (as well as a capacity to develop). Matter alone cannot account for this individuality. Borden Sharkey sees Stein's account of the relation between individual and universal as influenced by Husserl's accounts in Logical Investigations and in Ideas I. Individuals instantiate universals. Chapter Six gives a particularly clear account of Husserl's understanding of wholes, dependent parts and independent parts, and how this is taken up by Stein. Human nature as such is a form, but too empty and incomplete to ever come into existence on its own. It needs the determinacy given by individual human beings. Borden Sharkey's book situates Stein's discussion of individuality in relation to the philosophies of Plato, Aristotle, Aquinas and Scotus with some reference to Husserl's ontology. She finds Stein's account of individuals attractive but in the end opts for a modified Thomist position. Borden Sharkey's critique of Stein is based on the view that the Thomistic account of angelic individuality requires that angels occupy different ranks in a hierarchy. This goes against Stein's claim for the radical equality of all human beings. Stein herself contrasts humans and angels by saying that humans have hidden depths to their natures whereas angelic natures are transparent to themselves. Furthermore, for Aquinas, strictly speaking, it is designated matter -- not prime matter -- that is the principle of individuation.

Borden Sharkey's monograph is a valuable contribution to the research literature of the later Stein. She shows great familiarity with Stein's work and great affinity with her project to develop an ontology of individual personhood. Furthermore Borden Sharkey, admirably, does not attempt to draw a sharp contrast between the earlier phenomenological Stein and the mature Catholic metaphysician. Stein was an intensely sincere and deep thinker who sought to explore the uniqueness of the individual person and the depth of personal being drawing on diverse resources. She sought to do so, in particular, by rethinking (unencumbered by the need to accurately reflect the history of philosophy) the categories of essence, form, matter, act and potency inherited from the Neo-Aristotelian Scholastics but informed by the ontological considerations of Husserl, Conrad-Martius, Heidegger and others.

Borden Sharkey's essay is a first step in a very complex terrain, but one which can yield much insight. The whole subject of the interrelation between Husserl's (and the early Munich school phenomenologists, including Conrad-Martius, Hering and others) interest in ontology (including formal ontology), Heidegger's fundamental ontology, and Scheler's and Stein's personalism is most complex and fascinating. Even more challenging is to bring these ontological discourses into relation with the historical context in Aristotle and Aquinas. Stein's work is extremely rich in insight, even if its overall systematic ambition remains unconvincing. More will need to be done to articulate the understanding of essence in Husserl and Stein (especially given the revival of interest in formal ontology and analytic metaphysics), but Borden Sharkey has made a significant contribution to this challenging field and has admirably demonstrated Edith Stein's importance as an original philosopher of depth.

[1] Edith Stein, Endliches und Ewiges Sein: Versuch eines Aufstiegs zum Sinn des Seins,, Edith Stein Werke Band II (Freiburg: Herder, 1949), trans. Kurt F. Reinhart as Finite and Eternal Being (Washington, DC: ICS Publications, 2002). Hereafter 'FEB' followed by the page number of the English translation. Borden Sharkey uses her own translation in citing passages from this work but maintains references to the page numbers of the published English translation.

[2] Edith Stein, Potenz und Akt. Studien zu einer Philosophie des Seins, ed. Hans-Rainer Sepp, Edith Stein Gersamtausgabe 10 (Freiburg: Herder, 2005). English translation: Potency and Act: Studies Toward a Philosophy of Being, ed. L. Gelber and Romaeus Leuven, O.C.D, trans. Walter Redmond, The Collected Works of Edith Stein, Vol. 11 (Washington, DC: ICS Publications. 2009).

[3] Both versions have now been published as a parallel text as 'Husserl and Aquinas: A Comparison', in Edith Stein, Knowledge and Faith, trans. Walter Redmond, The Collected Works of Edith Stein VIII (Washington, DC: ICS Publications, 2000), pp. 1-63.

[4] Erich Przywara, Analogia Entis (Munich, 1932), a translation by John Betz and David Bentley Hart is in preparation for Eerdmans.

[5] See Jean Hering, 'Bemerkungen über das Wesen, die Wesenheit und die Idee', Jahrbuch für Phänomenologie und phänomenologische Philosophie vol. 4 (1921), pp. 495-543.