Thinking about the Emotions: A Philosophical History

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Alix Cohen and Robert Stern (eds.), Thinking about the Emotions: A Philosophical History, Oxford University Press, 2017, 321pp., $70.00, ISBN 9780198766858.

Reviewed by Simo Knuuttila, University of Helsinki


The editors write that "the volume proposes to investigate the philosophical history of the emotions by bringing together leading historians of philosophy and covering a wide spectrum of schools of thought and epochs, from ancient philosophy up to twentieth-century accounts" (1). The work contains one paper on Aristotle, one on Aquinas and Ockham, three on seventeenth-century philosophers (Descartes, Hobbes, Spinoza, Malebranche), four on eighteenth-century philosophers (Shaftesbury and Hutcheson, Kant, Hume, Schiller) and five on post-Kantian philosophy (Schopenhauer and Nietzsche, the Brentano school, Heidegger, Sartre, and analytic philosophy). It is hence mostly a study of the emotions in modern and contemporary Western philosophy.

A more encompassing "philosophical history" would involve chapters on Stoicism, Augustine and Augustinianism, Avicenna and his influence, and Byzantine philosophy. The range of the book is then more limited than one might expect, but the authors are recognized experts in their areas, the papers are of high historical quality, and many of them include interesting philosophical comments. There are minor shortcomings in the basically well done editorial work: some often-mentioned concepts such as "formal object" are not found in the index, and it was also not a good idea to leave the present authors out of the index, since some of them are often referred to because of their other publications. When referring to translated sources, some authors helpfully give important original terms in brackets. More of this would have been welcome, as well as the dates of the main historical figures.

In his extensive and many-faceted contribution, Kevin Mulligan addresses the criticism of William James's account of emotions by Franz Brentano and his students and followers, particularly Edmund Husserl and other phenomenologists. This Austro-German criticism is characterized as being based on an unfamiliar philosophy of the mind representing an "unusual, subtle, and baroque" account of the emotions. Mulligan offers an exegetical and philosophical discussion of the central distinctions and terminological peculiarities of this approach, which regards James's thesis of emotions as perceived bodily affects as badly mistaken. According to Fabrice Teroni's last chapter of the volume ("In Pursuit of Emotional Modes: The Philosophy of Emotions after James"), most philosophers have argued, in the same way, that emotions are not perceptions of physiological changes, since they typically include intentional attitudes with respect to external objects.

The main figures in Mulligan's chapter are Carl Stumpf, Edmund Husserl, and Max Scheler. Other Austro-German authors commented on are Anton Marty, Moritz Geiger, Edith Stein, Adolph Reinach and Dietrich von Hildebrand (the last two are missing in the bibliography). The tenets of this tradition are compared with Ludwig Wittgenstein's views, which show similarities with the James criticism of Brentano's phenomenological heirs, but not with their account of the mental complexity of emotions and the reality of values as objects of emotion.

Mulligan deals with distinctions between affective phenomena which are intentionally directed and those which are not, between perceptual, organic and affective sensations, between modes and contents of objects, and between different types of objects of emotions. In one paragraph, he comments on Edith Stein's remarks on the ways of being affected by others. These include attraction and repulsion and, more generally, the affects of uneasiness, disquiet, exaltation, and relief, all of which may reveal the values of subjects and their emotional attitudes towards objects exemplifying such values. Referring to these states, Mulligan suggests that they are "simply examples of James's organic or visceral sensations, felt bodily commotions" (p. 235). When Stein wrote about the uneasiness that disclosed the disvalue of her act of envy, why ought she have thought that it was simply a visceral sensation? This seems not to be an issue here, though the experiences may be accompanied by an awareness of physiological changes.

In his chapter just mentioned, Teroni addresses the discussion of emotions in the analytic philosophy of mind that continues the criticism of James's theory. He deals with judgment theories (for example, Martha Nussbaum's), knowledge-belief theories (for example, Robert Gordon's), affective perceptual theories (for example, Sabine A. Döring's, Robert C. Roberts', Christine Tappolet's) and various problems in these accounts, arguing that the problems derive from reducing emotions to other mental phenomena which are not "emotional". In order to avoid this, Teroni suggests that emotions are basic psychological modes that can be compared to other modes but not reduced to them. Some have suggested that emotions typically have a compositional structure as in Aristotle (cognitive, affective, conative, physical), but Teroni does not pay attention to this approach. He writes (p. 293) that in order to avoid ambiguities in the use of the term 'feeling', he is exclusively concerned with feeling in a Jamesian sense (proprioceptive awareness of physiological changes). This causes some difficulty in commenting on theories that associate cognition with an emotional feeling about non-Jamesian objects or treat the center of emotion as a felt evaluation (Peter Goldie's, Bennett W. Helm's).

Another brief summary of the discussion of emotions in Anglo-American analytic philosophy is included in the opening chapter by Daniel Garber, who compares it with the approaches to passions in seventeenth-century rationalists (Descartes, Malebranche and Spinoza). He argues that the main difference between these intellectual episodes is that while the theory of emotions is understood as a relatively autonomous part of philosophical psychology in the former, the latter is elaborated in the environment of larger metaphysical, ethical, or theological themes. Garber is more sympathetic to the early modern approach, thinking that it might lead contemporary philosophers to think about their presumptions in a more analytic way.

Terence Irwin addresses Aristotle's remarks on the Platonic parts of the soul and his account of the passions and the virtues. This is the longest chapter and the only one on ancient philosophy. Beginning from Aristotle's discussion of continence and incontinence, Irwin sheds light on what is meant by listening to reason in emotional contexts in Aristotle and in Aquinas's interpretation of Aristotle's indirect rationality of emotions. Irwin provides a detailed study of Aristotle's formulations of this matter in various places. The chapter makes useful reading for philosophers interested in the ancient theory as such and its more or less accurate contemporary applications, such as virtue ethics.

There are no studies on Arabic medieval philosophy or Byzantine philosophy. Medieval Latin philosophy is addressed by Dominic Perler, who compares the approach of Aquinas and Ockham to the emotions of the sensory part and their relation to the faculties of the rational soul, along with various examples of how these might be understood. Perler is particularly interested in Ockham's view of the emotions of the rational part of the soul (the passions of the will) which do not require bodily changes as the passions necessarily do in Aquinas's hylomorphism.

Medieval accounts of the passions of the will have recently attracted scholarly interest; they were introduced by Bonaventure and other Franciscan authors and extensively treated by John Duns Scotus. While Scotus regarded the passions of the will (distress and joy) as caused by moods of the will rather than its free acts, Perler argues that Ockham actually treats all occurrent volitions as passions. As a voluntarist, Ockham characterized simple acts of the will as free. He followed Scotus's characterization of distress and joy as non-free passive reactions, but apparently thought that the names of sensory passions can be also applied to the free acts of the will, since the will is an immaterial moving power analogous to the sensory moving power, except the former is free and the latter is not. Perler does not consider how seriously Ockham wanted to give up the traditional way of speaking about emotions as passive reactions and to introduce a conception of emotions that would also include the free acts.

Seventeenth-century theories are briefly summarized in Garber's opening chapter (Descartes, Spinoza, Malebranche) and more extensively in Amy Schmitter's study on the principles of emotional taxonomies in Descartes and Hobbes and Lilli Alanen's "Affects and Ideas in Spinoza's Therapy of Passions". Schmitter argues that the leading position of "wonder" in Descartes's list of basic emotions and that of "glory" in Hobbes's scheme have theoretical and cultural causes, and that attending to both aspects may help one to understand the lists from the contemporary point of view. The approach of both historical authors is dominated by the new mechanistic physics: wonder is the passion which in Descartes's dualism makes the interplay between intentional attention and causal physics understandable, and glory in Hobbes's mechanism exemplifies the competitive behavior in human life with no other ultimate goal than "being foremost". It is not quite clear what is cultural, and what theoretical, in this picture. There are few references to contemporary philosophical literature on the emotions in Descartes and Spinoza in Schmitter's contribution, but she mentions some further seventeenth-century taxonomies. Apart from these, those who find lists and diagrams interesting could consult Christian Thomasius's elaborated tables for constructing emotional profiles of persons (Ausübung der Sittenlehre, 1696).

Like Garber, Lilli Alanen reads Spinoza's theory of emotions as an attempt to moderate and master our affects by turning passive emotions such as sorrow into active joy with the help of philosophical therapy. This antidote against disturbing emotion is compatible with Spinoza's determinist monism and consists in increasing understanding the causes of the motions of the soul. After a detailed analysis of the main themes of Spinoza's philosophy of emotions with useful references to secondary literature, Alanen ends with somewhat skeptical comments on the efficacy of this sort of therapy, in spite of the testimony of many admirers of Spinoza.

Laurent Jaffro turns to the discussion of laughter in Shaftesbury and Hutcheson, both of whom found Hobbes's definition of laugher as "sudden glory" too narrow. They distinguished between various kinds of emotion associated with laughter and considered the social aspect of ridicule. Jaffro pays particular attention to the different social and political role of laugher in these authors. While Hutcheson was for limitations of derision, Shaftesbury argued for the good effects of a free market. Jaffro's chapter addresses a less-studied subject, differing in this respect from the papers on Descartes, Hobbes, Spinoza, Kant, and Hume, which concentrate on special questions in much-studied contexts.

Elizabeth S. Radcliffe addresses Hume's taxonomical ideas and his suggestions for controlling some passions through contrary passions by cultivating strength of mind, neutralizing one passion by another, or developing the virtue of greatness of mind or heroic virtue. Radcliffe is the author of the related book Hume on Action and Passion (Oxford University Press, 2017). Alix Cohen turns to the significance Kant attached to the cultivation of emotions as an indirect duty. While many commentators do not regard this as a moral duty, Cohen argues the contrary. This is an interesting discussion of a controversial question. The paper is rather succinct, which makes it hard to evaluate her argument. Somewhat strangely, the author lists the names of the interpreters who argue in the same direction without explaining how and where, but some of their works are included in the book Kant on Emotions and Value, which she edited (Palgrave Macmillan, 2014).

Friedrich Schiller's views of the interplay between rationality and emotions are discussed by Christopher Bennett. Schiller developed a particular aesthetic theory of grace and freedom which was meant to bridge the gap between reason and sensibility in Kant's ethics. This often-debated position is considered from various perspectives in Bennett's contribution with links to the history of aesthetics and moral philosophy. The dates and original titles of Schiller's works would have been welcome, as well some historical information on Schiller, who is known more to historians of literature than to historians of philosophy.

Christopher Janaway analyses the views of Schopenhauer and Nietzsche on emotions and cognition. While Schopenhauer argued that emotions simply disturb epistemic activities and should be avoided in epistemic culture, Nietzsche held that they were essentially connected with epistemic striving and may make it prosper. Janaway offers a well-considered interpretation of these approaches, arguing for the plausibility and attractiveness of Nietzsche's affective knowledge and perspectivism with replies to the criticism of his earlier approach to Nietzsche.

Nietzsche is often considered a central figure in so-called continental philosophy, as are Heidegger and Sartre, whose views of emotions are addressed by Sacha Golob and Anthony Hatzimoysis. In his paper "Methodological Anxiety: Heidegger on Moods and Emotions", Golob focuses on Heidegger's account of the mood of anxiety. The detailed consideration of this concept is followed by a critical assessment which involves questions about the nature of anxiety, Heidegger's negative attitude towards critical debate and dialogue, and the veracity of the approach and its internal plausibility.

Hatzimoysis analyses Sartre's phenomenological theory of emotional experience in the Sketch for the Theory of the Emotion (1939) and The Imaginary (1940). It is argued that, while these accounts seem to be incompatible, one could interpret them to mean that the former was written from a third-person perspective and the latter from a first-person one. This proposal leads to the question of the philosophical coherence of Sartre's philosophy of emotions. The central notions addressed by Hatzimoysis include those on intentionality, affectivity, subjectivism, representationism, pre-reflective consciousness, and affective qualities, about which Sartre writes that, when they disappear, perception may remain intact and 'yet the world is singularly impoverished'.