Thomas Aquinas on God and Evil

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Brian Davies, Thomas Aquinas on God and Evil, Oxford University Press, 2011, 163pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199790906

Reviewed by Fergus Kerr, University of Edinburgh


Brian Davies, who teaches philosophy at Fordham University, established himself as an authoritative exponent of Aquinas with The Thought of Thomas Aquinas (1995). More polemically, in The Reality of God and the Problem of Evil (2006), he engaged with current attempts to reconcile belief in the goodness of God with the existence of horrendous evils in the world. Now, in this relatively short book, Davies sets out what Aquinas says about God and evil, contrasting his views with what the usual suspects among our contemporaries say, but only in enough detail to highlight what is distinctive about Aquinas. This, according to Davies, is that Aquinas does not recognize the "problem of evil" at all, as commonly construed, whether by ordinary people or by most philosophers of religion. As he explains, this book aims simply to expound what Aquinas says, no more and no less, without dealing with objections. While hoping that teachers of philosophy and theology will find something of interest in the book, he claims his "target audience" to be people with no previous knowledge of philosophy, theology or Aquinas. As regards his fellow professionals, Davies must have his tongue in his cheek: few of them, he clearly thinks, have any understanding of what Aquinas thought on this matter. As regards absolute beginners Davies is perhaps a little optimistic, as of course, judging by the prologue to the Summa Theologiae, Aquinas himself may have been.

Within the first two pages we meet J.L. Mackie and William Rowe, for whom the existence of evil proves the non-existence of God. On the next page Alvin Plantinga, Richard Swinburne and John Hick appear: without being discussed in detail they are taken in various ways to represent philosophers of religion who try to save divine goodness by arguing that God (1) could not have created a world without evil, or (2) included evils to provide opportunities for moral growth, or (3) granted us the freedom to act contrary to divine will and even independently of it. Such proposals, natural and plausible as they may seem, represent varieties of theodicy, which, as Davies aims to show, Aquinas would have found unintelligible.

For Aquinas some basic truths about God can be worked out on purely philosophical grounds (chapter 2), including the metaphysical assumptions that provide the context for his views about evil.  We begin with "what there is" (chapter 3): some philosophers deny that existence is a predicate; for others, however, such as Peter Geach and Anthony Kenny, it can make perfect sense. (Surprisingly Davies never refers to Barry Miller.) Then, to say that things have being (esse) is to say that they are "good" (chapter 4): the key point being, as Davies insists, that the terms "good" and "bad" need not express moral approval and disapproval. The fundamental meaning of "good" is "desirable" or "attractive".

Some are naïvely inclined to place the distinction between God and creatures in our being contingent while God alone is necessary (chapter 5): for Aquinas, however, the distinction lies, rather, in creatures' being such that our existence and essence differ, whereas no such difference is to be found in God. Whether causa sui is the right name for the god of the philosophers (as Heidegger famously claimed), God is not caused by anything for Aquinas, as Davies rightly says -- not even by himself (p. 49).

God is "the ultimate good", which does not mean that God should be thought of as having moral virtues as we do (chapter 6): when speaking of divine goodness Aquinas never mentions duties or obligations on God's part. For that matter, as Davies notes, the notion of moral obligation does not lie at the heart of his ethical theory concerning ourselves.

With these non-controversial principles in place Davies can move to consider evil. For Aquinas, there cannot be a material world such as ours without material agents interacting -- which will include injuring each other ("evil suffered"): wolves eat lambs and so on (chapter 7). We might think that God ought to have made a world without evil suffered let alone evil done. God could have done so, Aquinas thought, but such a world would not be remotely like ours -- "ours being a material world in which some things flourish at the expense of others, and one in which there are people able not to choose well" (p. 72). Wicked acts, "evil done", "are evidently beings and classified in the category of being", as Aquinas says, but the evil in evil done "has a cause only in the sense that it can be accounted for in terms of someone not choosing to act well, not in the sense that it is something made to exist by God" (p. 71). The key point, again, is that Aquinas does not regard God's goodness as definable by anything that we might treat as moral obligation. Moreover, the "free-will defense" plays no part in this account: God does not merely "permit" us to do sinful things, these things are caused to be by God just like everything else. Human freedom never consists in our acting independently of God. On the other hand, for Aquinas, this does not mean, as we might be tempted to conclude, that God determines our acts. Rather, as creatively causing us to act as we do, God makes us do as we do by our own undertaking. God does not interfere even in the sinful choices that we make.

Of course Christian revelation is relevant: in chapters 8 and 9 Davies recapitulates what Aquinas says about providence and grace, then the Trinity and Christ, respectively. The concluding chapter sums up and with the thirty pages of notes and bibliography offers a starting point for further discussion. As its stands, however, this book successfully shows that the natural question -- "How can a morally good God permit the evils that occur even though he could have prevented them?" -- rests on some deep metaphysical assumptions that Aquinas would have found unacceptable.