Thomas Aquinas on Human Nature: A Philosophical Study of Summa Theologiae 1a 75-89

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Pasnau, Robert, Thomas Aquinas on Human Nature: A Philosophical Study of Summa Theologiae 1a 75-89, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 512pp., $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-00189-7.

Reviewed by Gareth B. Matthews , University of Massachusetts at Amherst


The study of St. Thomas Aquinas has too often been focused on learning, by imitation, to speak his philosophical language. Many of those who have mastered the lingo then, quite understandably, disdain translation into the now current language of philosophy. One result of all this is that Thomistic insights are too often lost on the Thomistically illiterate. A second is that Thomistic claims are far less likely to be subjected to the scrutiny accorded the views of modern philosophers.

Robert Pasnau’s learned and yet highly accessible study of Aquinas’s philosophy of human nature is a welcome departure from the deplorable tendency to ghettoize the master philosopher of the high middle ages. His Aquinas, while not exactly our own contemporary, is nevertheless willing and able to translate his scholastic terminology into the present-day philosophical vernacular and to debate our contemporaries on their own terms.

Questions 75-89 of the First Part (Prima pars) of St. Thomas’s great Summa theologiae constitute what has been traditionally called “The Treatise on Man,” or, as Pasnau prefers, “The Treatise on Human Nature.” Pasnau discusses these fifteen questions in the twelve chapters, plus Introduction and Epilogue, that make up his book. Part I (“Essential Features”) takes up the material in questions 75 and 76 on the human soul and body. Part II (“Capacities”) covers questions 77 through 83 on the capacities of the soul, including sensation, common sense, consciousness, natural appetite, rational choice, freedom, and the will. Part III (“Functions”) covers questions 84 through 89. Three of its four chapters concern the human mind. The last considers life after death, including questions about personal identity and the resurrection. The Epilogue is a wonderfully rich and wide-ranging, yet also remarkably compact, essay on Divine creation called, “Why did God make me?”

The sixty pages of footnotes to this volume constitute a valuable meta-commentary. They offer helpful scholarly and linguistic information, as well as insightful connections to philosophy before and after Aquinas, including interestingly relevant points from the philosophy of the last half of the 20th century. Scattered through Pasnau’s text are mini-essays, boxed off from the rest of the text, yet inserted at just the point where they are most relevant; each of these short essays enriches the reader’s understanding of some key term, concept, or question relevant to the surrounding discussion.

The impressive virtues of Pasnau’s book display themselves already in the early chapters, for example, in Chapter 2, which is a commentary on Question 75, article 2, of the Prima pars. In the table of contents this chapter is titled “The immateriality of soul,” whereas the chapter itself is headed “Soul as substance.” Readers who have already been introduced to Aquinas may be surprised, even shocked, by the second title. Thus, according to a standard reading of St. Thomas, the human soul is not a substance, but rather a subsisting thing. Calling it a “subsisting thing” signals its independence from the physical body whose substantial form it is and allows for the possibility of a human afterlife. Denying that it is a substance signals that, without a body, it is only an incomplete thing, which will be made complete again at the resurrection.

Pasnau’s reading of Aquinas on this pivotal issue is not, however, as strongly dualistic as his chapter heading suggests. He allows that “Aquinas usually refers to the soul as subsistent, and only occasionally speaks of it as a substance.” (48) Moreover, in the proof-text Pasnau first cites, he has Aquinas “explaining that to be a substance in this context means to be subsistent.” (45) Later he writes: “Aquinas in fact has two senses of subsistence (and two senses of substancehood) …” (49). His idea is that it is only in the weak sense of ‘substance’ that the human soul is a substance, a sense in which even a human hand can count as a substance.

There follows an interesting discussion of subsistence and separability. Pasnau points out that “Aquinas cannot accept that separability and subsistence are mutually entailing,” since one’s hand is not separable from one’s body. (Aquinas is here appealing to the familiar Aristotelian doctrine that a severed hand is only homonymously a hand.) To establish separability Aquinas argues that the mind has an operation “on its own” that the body has no share in. (50) His argument for that conclusion relies in part on assuming that “there is no kind of corporeal stuff that we are inherently precluded from cognizing” (53) and that what “can have cognition of certain things must have none of the things in its own nature.” (64)

In a characteristic display of candor, Pasnau admits that he does not see how to defend this argument (which is, of course, derived from Aristotle’s De anima 3.4). He points out that Aquinas himself distinguishes between being in the mind concretely and being in the mind intentionally (57), which distinction seems to undermine the force of the argument. Thus even if being concretely F rules out being concretely G, it need not rule out being intentionally G. So even if we were to agree that the pupil of the eye, “if it is to be capable of seeing all colors, must lack all color,” Pasnau argues, we would not be forced to conclude that “if the mind were just the gray matter of the brain, the mind would be incapable of thinking of anything other than gray matter.” (57)

At this point in his discussion Pasnau inserts a mini-essay, boxed off from the surrounding discussion, on arguments of this form:

1. The mind is capable of x.
2. Nothing _ is capable of x.
3. Therefore, the mind is not _ .

Aquinas, Pasnau tells us, “lets x be cognizing the natures of all bodies and lets _ be bodily or using a bodily organ.” But we could, if we wanted, let x be conscious experience and _ be material. The conclusion would then be that the mind is not material. Pasnau discusses, briefly, the support Leibniz tries to give this argument and then adds:

a more exotic version of this same basic form replaces x with grasping certain mathematical truths and _ with that works like a computer. The argument for 2 then rests on Gödel’s proof of the incompleteness of arithmetic, reasoning that we can grasp the truth of certain mathematical statements that cannot be proved by any computational algorithm. (56)

This boxed-off mini-essay is a perfect example of the kind of enrichment Pasnau gives to his discussion of Aquinas, including helpful references to the thought of important 20th-century philosophers.

Chapter 3, “The unity of body and soul,” comments in a similarly enriched and expansive way on Question 76 of the Summa theologiae. But Chapter 4 comes as something of a surprise. Titled “When human life begins,” it discusses human conception, abortion, identity through time, and even, in passing, euthanasia. Although, as Pasnau shows, Thomistic views on these questions develop naturally out of what is presented in Questions 75 and especially 76, neither abortion nor euthanasia is explicitly discussed anywhere in the Treatise on Human Nature.

Pasnau has at least a partly political motive for including a full discussion of St. Thomas’s views on human embryology and their bearing on the issue of abortion in his treatment of Question 76. He notes that interest in the philosophy of Aquinas is often directly connected with sympathy for the Roman Catholic Church. Natural as this association may be, Pasnau regards it as unfortunate, especially in light of what he regards as the Church’s “noxious social agenda” (105) on, among other things, abortion. He wants to demonstrate that Aquinas actually “provides the resources to show something of what is wrong with the Church’s position.” (ibid.)

According to Pasnau, Aquinas thinks that the human brain “has sufficiently developed by around mid-gestation to support the operations of intellect.” At that point the human soul is “infused all at once by God.” (50) Before that time, the human embryo has an animal, but not a human soul, and, even before that, a vegetative soul. Aquinas’s position, Pasnau tells us, even though it rests on a dubious empirical claim about neurological development in the fetus, is admirably conservative. Thus, according to Pasnau, Aquinas pushes “the beginnings of human life as far back as he can while remaining consistent with his broader theory of the soul.” (119-20)

For the remainder of this review I shall focus especially on Pasnau’s discussion of Aquinas on human freedom, which takes up sections 2, 3, and 4 of Chapter 7. Although there are many other topics of great philosophical interest in Pasnau’s book, these pages display in concise form the features of the book that make it so engaging and so relevant to the concerns of philosophers today.

On the face of it, Aquinas seems to have made a grave philosophical mistake in burdening his discussion of human freedom by accepting the concept of the will. Aquinas viewed Aristotle as “the philosopher” and tried, where he could, to use Aristotelian ideas and principles in developing his own Christian philosophy. But Aristotle, like ancient philosophers more generally, seems not to have had the concept of the will. It is principally Augustine who introduced that concept into Western philosophy. Arguably Aristotle was better off in his attempt to give an account of free or voluntary action without having to say what a free will is, or would be.

Aristotle can be reasonably taken to have offered a “defeasibility” account of voluntary action, according to which what we do is presumptively free unless a claim of ignorance or compulsion or some other incapacitating condition could properly be said to defeat that presumption. To introduce the idea of a will and suppose that one acts freely if, and only if, one’s will acts freely poses a terrible dilemma. Either the free action of the will must somehow be thought to erupt into the world uncaused, a thought unfriendly to both science and morality, or else its freedom must somehow be considered compatible with its having been caused to act. Neither horn of this dilemma has been thought to be very welcome. And a generally acceptable escape route between the horns of this dilemma has proved elusive.

According to Pasnau, “Aquinas’s theory of free decision falls into the class of views now described as compatibilist – accounts on which freedom can coexist with cognitive and volitional systems that function in entirely deterministic ways, necessitated by the sum of prior events.” (221) With this pronouncement Pasnau has Aquinas grasping the deterministic horn of the above dilemma. But there are numerous qualifications and caveats. Thus Pasnau concedes immediately that “Aquinas does not say that free decision is compatible with determinism… indeed he often seems to say the opposite.” (ibid.) He adds that he does not mean “Aquinas was committed to any form of physical or psychological determinism.” (ibid.) His primary claim is “Aquinas explains human freedom without any recourse to an uncaused, undetermined act of will or intellect – as if only an uncaused decision could count as a free decision.” (ibid.)

Yet Pasnau states in bold letters and discusses at some length Aquinas’s assertion, “Whoever has free decision has it to will and not to will, to act and not to act.” (222) This sounds like the familiar “could have done otherwise” condition for free will. Pasnau considers an interpretation of this claim according to which “the role of reason is simply to provide options, and that it is the will that freely chooses, selecting the option that it likes the best.” (222) But, after quoting a number of relevant passages from various Thomistic works, Pasnau concludes on Aquinas’s behalf, that “it is incoherent … to suppose that the will might be indeterminately free to choose one option or another, and might make that choice without being determined to do so.” (223)

Pasnau then turns to Aquinas claim, “That is free that occurs by cause of itself.” (224) It might seem that Aquinas here makes the self-caused volition a break in the causal chain. But Pasnau points out that Aquinas immediately adds: “Freedom does not necessarily require that the thing that is free be the first cause of itself.” (224) Indeed, as Aquinas writes elsewhere, “the will’s movement comes directly from the will and from God.” (227)

One suspects that ‘cause’ and ‘comes from’ have slippery meanings here. Surely no act of God’s will caused my free decision yesterday to have a chocolate sundae after a full meal.

Pasnau goes on to consider Aquinas’s attention to higher-order volitions. For example: “I will to become healthier … and so I will myself to take a particular medicine.”(228) This complication, he assures us, “connects [Aquinas’s] action theory with his moral theory, inasmuch as crucial virtues (justice and charity) just are dispositions of the will.” (229) So “human beings are in control of their acts because of a capacity for higher-order judgments and higher-order volitions.” (230) But, Pasnau admits, if, as his compatibilist reading of Aquinas implies, “all of our choices are causally necessitated, then eventually the causal chain must move outside of us” so that “our present choices are determined by factors that we cannot control.” (230)

In the end, Pasnau has Aquinas bite the bullet. “Given the entire state of the universe, including an individual’s higher-order beliefs and desires, a certain choice will inevitably follow.” (232) But, he supposes, one can concede this and still be consoled with the thought that we are at least very different from non-human animals. “Our higher-level beliefs and desires can take control of our immediate judgments and appetites.” (232) Thus, even if hungry, we may not eat. After all, we “may have given up meat, we may be dieting, we may suspect the food will make us sick.” (ibid.)

There is much more of philosophical interest in Pasnau’s discussion of human freedom than I have presented here. And, of course, there are many more topics of philosophical interest in his book than I have been able to cover. But perhaps I have said enough to make my general characterization of his book plausible.

This book is one of the most philosophically engaging treatments of Aquinas to appear in recent years. Several of its characteristics make it especially engaging. First, it is written in the style of a current philosophy article, not in the style of a purely scholarly study. Second, it is studded with references to philosophy from all periods, including the last half of the 20th century. The contemporary references are never at center stage; but they always enrich the discussion and they clearly make the point that Aquinas’s thought should give us live options for thinking about philosophical issues that concern people today, not just issues that concern historians of philosophy. Third, this book is full of candid assessments of the viability of Aquinas’s doctrines and analyses. These assessments come, not just at the ends of chapters, but all along the way. Pasnau reveals himself to be a deeply informed and generally Aquinas-friendly expositor and critic. But he never pretends that something is clearer than he really thinks it is, or more defensible than he considers it to be. The reader soon gains confidence that the interpretations offered here will be informed by, not just a careful reading of QQ 75-89 of the Prima pars, but also by a mature conception of the philosophy of St. Thomas.

This book is certainly a “must read” for devotees of Aquinas and medieval philosophy more generally. More important, it is also a work that can be read with profit and enjoyment by anyone at all interested in the views of St. Thomas on the basic questions of philosophy.