Thomas Aquinas's Summa Theologiae: A Guide and Commentary

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Brian Davies, Thomas Aquinas's Summa Theologiae: A Guide and Commentary, Oxford University Press, 2014, 454pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780199380633.

Reviewed by Christopher Martin, Center for Thomistic Studies, University of St. Thomas (TX)


The most striking thing about this book is its completeness. It is indeed an introductory guide to and a (brief) commentary on the whole of the Summa Theologiae -- the whole of the Summa Theologiae. One looks for, but does not find, special attention being given to the passages that so many Thomist philosophers regard as crucially important: the Five Ways, natural law, the principle of double effect, divine foreknowledge and human freedom, the immortality of the soul -- all the rag-bag of topics, more or less important in one context or another, with regard to which philosophers of religion and ethicists have so frequently turned for light from St. Thomas over the last fifty years or so.

The reason for this is elegantly and graphically shown in the remarkable figures displayed in the appendix on pp. 359-360, "The Summa Theologiae at a glance". In these simple pie charts Brian Davies effortlessly shows exactly how many questions, and how many articles, St. Thomas devotes to each of his major themes. "The Existence and Nature of God" occupy, fittingly, 25 questions divided into 149 articles, but it takes very little effort to notice or to remember that the Five Ways takes up one of those 149 articles. Law occupies 19 questions and 96 articles, but only two of those questions discuss the relations of eternal law and natural law. The discussion of God's knowledge of future contingents is dealt with by Davies on one page, and doesn't even show up in the pie charts in the appendix. Nor does the principle of double effect, which Davies indeed deals with in only four lines and a footnote. The immortality of the human soul St. Thomas deals with in two questions, out of 228 on human nature; Davies concludes his discussion in three pages.

This is not meant as a criticism of Davies, but rather as praise. He presents, as no other contemporary author has done, the complete scope of the Summa. Our personal favourite passages are certain to seem neglected or overlooked in his magnificent sweep -- what is perhaps more creditable is that Davies's own personal favourite passages receive no special attention. What does Davies offer instead?

What he offers is an introductory guide to and a commentary on the whole Summa -- a work perhaps few of us have read in its entirety, and perhaps none of us have read with the unflagging and unchoosy attention it deserves. Davies reminds us what the work is. For those who have perhaps been reading in St. Thomas for years and years, and also for those just beginning, it is a salutary reminder. The little things that seem so important to us -- because they impinge, perhaps in an important, even a vital way, on our own interests-- are seen in the context of a massive and masterly work -- a great forest which perhaps we have not seen, or are in danger of not seeing, for all the magnificent trees which we have found for ourselves there. Davies modestly says (p. xiv)

I then proceed in detail through the entire text of the Summa. I explain what it is arguing, what its structure is, how its key technical terms are to be understood, and how bits of it relate to other bits. People turning to the Summa Theologiae often seem to be more interested in some of its parts than in others. My aim, however, is to consider the Summa as a whole. Commentators on it often highlight certain sections of it while ignoring others, and their doing so is understandable. If we want to understand what the Summa Theologiae is, though, we need to plow through it while noting all that it has to offer.

Davies puts forward this aim in a modest manner, but reflection makes you realize how serious a task he has taken on. Admiration grows as you read through the book and realize that he has done no less than he promised.

The importance of this for those of us who have come to St. Thomas through an interest in this or that piece of argumentation that we have come across in our other reading -- that is to say, nearly all of us -- is immense. By reading this book we can learn, or re-learn, what kind of an author St. Thomas is, and what kind of book he is writing -- therefore, we can come to understand how our favourite bit of argumentation fits into his own mind and his own work. Davies's book has a preface, 22 chapters and an epilogue. Just looking through the chapter-headings, noting their sub-divisions and lengths, and comparing them with the pie charts in the appendix is a rewarding and sometimes a chastening experience. A philosopher realizes that all the arguments that are of such importance to him are at the service of faith, of grace, and of living well according to God's will. What a theologian may gain from it, I would not wish to speculate -- but Davies is clearly very conscious of the needs of theologians in his presentation, perhaps especially the needs of theologians formed in a Protestant tradition, who, one so often fears, have a tendency towards fideism (see, for example, pp. 20-21). And he also insists, and shows, that philosophy is present throughout the Summa. Davies confines his explicit remarks to a bare page at the end of his first chapter (p.16), but it is clear from his practice, as it is from St. Thomas's as he expounds it, that it is impossible to do theology adequately without philosophy. As one would expect from Davies, the whole is written with a masterly clarity, and in a way that will make it accessible to those with a training in analytic philosophy, as well as enlightening to those used to a more technical scholastic style.

The value of the book, clearly, is not one to be expounded by picking out this or that felicitous or infelicitous discussion of this or that point. Its value, if it has one, stands as a whole, and it is as a whole that the book will have its (I am sure, wholly positive) effect on the reader. But perhaps one or two themes might be picked out as running themes in Davies's exposition -- and once he has drawn our attention to them, it is clear that they are running themes in the Summa. One is God's causality, as Creator, its relation to other created causality, and the way Davies weaves this in with the problem of evil. This appears not only where one would expect it -- in the chapter on Creation (chapter 7) -- but keeps cropping up elsewhere as well. It appears in chapter 9, on human action, and in chapter 10, on human fulfillment, flourishing, or happiness, and again, most interestingly in chapter 13, on sin. Equally, I found fascinating and luminous his discussions of per accidens existents, final causality, emotions, habitus and the virtues, though of course what I found enlightening I also found regrettably short. At the same time, I know that some Thomists will regard Davies's treatment of metaphysical themes that they regard as of crucial importance as being sketchy, to say the least. I think that Davies's concern with causality, reality, and evil shows that he has indeed given serious thought to these questions, and it is a pity if his sensible eschewing of later Thomist terminology disguises it from them.

But true to my professed admiration for Davies's achievement, I must surely avoid discussing any strengths or weaknesses I find in his on-going discussion, and merely encourage others to read it. To do otherwise would be to concentrate on the trees of these or those passages from St. Thomas, and, disastrously, to fail to see the tracks through the forest that Davies is drawing to our attention.

One could find many details to praise in this book, and, perhaps, a good few details to cavil at. (And perhaps I should add my regrets at the failures or errors of copy-editing, proof-reading, and production, which Oxford University Press nowadays seem willing to let pass.) But this would be beside the point. The book is a superb corrective to many of us who live our life among texts honestly extracted, or, sometimes, I'm afraid to say, rather sneakily extorted from the works of St. Thomas: it allows us to step back and see his greatest work as a whole. It's the best possible preparation for a reading -- or, let us hope, a re-reading -- of the whole Summa. The book is intended as an introductory guide and commentary, and perhaps few of those who read it will get as far as reading the whole Summa. But those who read this book will be far better equipped to understand the fragments which they do get to read in the context of St. Thomas's mature thought as a whole. And for anyone who has merely to dip into the Summa from time to time, reading or re-reading the sections of this book that deal with what he or she is unfamiliar with will be a small effort and a brief time well spent in the best possible preparation.

To sum up: there are some people, perhaps fewer than one would hope, who have read the whole Summa Theologiae carefully and attentively. Some of these -- some who have done so recently, perhaps -- might not benefit very greatly from reading Davies's book. Everyone else definitely would.