Thomas Kuhn's Revolutions: A Historical and an Evolutionary Philosophy of Science?

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James A. Marcum, Thomas Kuhn's Revolutions: A Historical and an Evolutionary Philosophy of Science?, Bloomsbury, 2015, 287pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781472530493.

Reviewed by John A. Schuster, University of Sydney


This work extends and expands James A. Marcum's Thomas Kuhn's Revolution: An Historical Philosophy of Science (2005). Scholarship and debate about Kuhn have continued apace since then, chiefly conducted by philosophers and mainly concerned with Kuhn's later thought and its relation to Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962, 1970) [SSR]. Marcum takes up the theme that Kuhn's later work -- scattered in occasional papers, talks and manuscript sources -- constituted a second Kuhnian revolution in philosophy of science, this time being an 'evolutionary' [EPS] as opposed to his earlier 'historical' philosophy of science.

Marcum's 2005 volume was essentially a history of a book, SSR, its genesis, content and reception in HPS and other fields. The present work preserves virtually all of that material while expanding in two ways: an account of the genesis and content of Kuhn's second philosophy of science, and a much more detailed examination than previously of what we might term, in succinct but outdated history-of -ideas lingo, the 'influence' of Kuhn. Thus, in the opening two Parts of the new work, Marcum stays close to the corresponding Parts of the earlier work. Part III, which concluded the earlier work and was titled 'The path following Structure', is now titled 'Kuhn's paradigm shift' [that is toward EPS] and Chapter 5 within it is still concerned mainly with 'What was Kuhn up to after Structure', while Chapter 6 deals explicitly with Kuhn's EPS, replacing the old Chapter 6 dealing with 'Kuhn's legacy'. The latter issue now takes up its own Part IV, in two full chapters, the first dealing with Kuhn's 'impact' on HPS and the natural sciences, the latter with his 'impact' on behavioural, social and political sciences.

Returning to the Kuhn debates after a decade, Marcum now has a work at least 30% longer than the original, girded by a bibliography at least three times as voluminous and featuring not only works published since 2005, but also quite a few earlier works not treated in his original volume. Readers can again benefit from Marcum's no-nonsense chronological account of the origin of SSR and especially from his examination of Kuhn's early Lowell Lectures (32-36), still in manuscript, which contain the embryonic forms of several key SSR themes. As before, Marcum perceptively views SSR more as a process of genesis and then revision and rethinking in the heat of philosophical battle, rather than a finished work (as of 1962 or 1970).

Similarly, the great benefit to the reader of the new and expanded portions of the work is Marcum's workmanlike and chronological setting out of the development of Kuhn's second coming in the philosophy of science. Marcum sees EPS as improving upon SSR by answering or creatively outflanking highly debated points about incommensurability and the pattern of development and proliferation of the sciences. Kuhnian incommensurability is now located in non-cumulative shifts in the 'lexical taxonomy' of kinds terms specific to an expert scientific field. Agreed shifts in a lexicon, emergent from the need to solve recalcitrant research puzzles, produce splitting, increased specialisation and a Darwinian looking branching evolution of the sciences. Heated philosophical debates about the later Kuhn are treated dispassionately if at times a bit too cryptically, summary replacing firm positioning and argument back into the debate.

The latter point begins to signal my chief concerns about the book, which may be condensed to this question: "Is this book a worthy and useful textbook or a concerted, serious intellectual history (including intellectual biography, of course)?" I believe the book tries to be both but winds up slightly but noticeably missing each target. This is a shame, because the book promises much, by scope, quantity of scholarship, and Marcum's own power of expression.

The book has the look and feel of a textbook: each chapter is prefaced with a set off 'summary' and ends with an in-text 'summary section'; the style is brisk, and the text rolls through summaries of texts, papers, books and debates. As an historian of science who taught Kuhn at introductory, advanced undergraduate and post graduate levels for 40 years, I can testify that Marcum's work cannot be used at entry level, and would have to be selectively used at an advanced (or English and Australian style 'honours') undergraduate level. For example, in my honours level course, for third year HPS majors, I would have avoided Marcum's material expounding SSR and the blow by blow account of the current debates over Kuhn's EPS; but, the intellectual biography of Kuhn leading to SSR and the treatment of Kuhn's earlier published and unpublished works would have been assigned. I would not recommend this book to history of science post graduates in any way under my tutelage, for reasons set out below.

The book's best use as a textbook would be for philosophers of science, advanced students and their practitioner instructors, looking for a quick first guide to Kuhn's struggles to write, defend and then revise SSR, and as a similar sort of guide to the key points and literature of the initial philosophical Kuhn debates. However, using Marcum as a handbook would have limitations, because he avoids deep excursions into interpretative explication. For example, whilst we get a detailed and well documented chronological overview of the debates concerning the later Kuhn, we learn of Kuhn's views only piecemeal from quick looks at the very scattered pieces in which it resides. There is little attempt, first to synthesise a 'Marcum version' of the 'later Kuhn's EPS', which could then have been used as the sounding board and explicatory bass note when marching chronologically through the debate. This lack of deep interpretation and reconstruction elides into the problem of the book not being particularly convincing intellectual history.

Serious intellectual history and intellectual biography consist in more than presenting a chronological set of textual summaries, even if some of those texts are parts of debates. Any number of serious historical narratives cum explanations of, say, the emergence of SSR, might be grounded on such a chronological archive as Marcum provides, but they would have to go quite a bit further, in terms of interpretation and analysis of the agendas, resources in play, problems and struggles of Kuhn and his key interlocutors.

For example, Marcum's treatment of Alexandre Koyré is peremptory, consisting of several brief mentions at different chronological points (11, 26, 38, 75, 112). We learn little about what Koyré was trying to do, and how Kuhn struggled within and beyond Koyré's dispensation. It is perhaps not well known that in the late 1960s and early 1970s Kuhn would summon his first year Princeton HPS graduate students to a meeting with him on their first day. To this gathering he would bring his tattered copy of Koyré's Études Galiléennes, the 1939 edition. (Of course there was no English translation until 1978.) He would hold it up and pronounce, "Nobody is getting out of here until they have read this." Kuhn meant nobody would graduate who did not come to understand Koyré (and Kuhn himself) as practitioners of textual analysis and internalist history of science writing.

Kuhn was devoted to Koyré: He took up and pluralized Koyré's notion of the centrality of metaphysics -- the metaphysics of any given real science need not be Galileo and Copernicus's watered down neo-Platonism. Kuhn searched for what Koyré's notion of ruptural revolution lacked, to wit, an explanation of what it was about science dynamics that led to and shaped revolutions (enter eventually normal science). Kuhn shared and disseminated Koyré's disdain for doctrines of scientific method as keys to scientific practice and the shape of the history of the sciences. He also less fortuitously was led by Koyré's catastrophism to downplay the creativity of normal science, the role of small but significant discoveries in science, and to miss the dynamics of what we might call the politics of experiment. Koyré is not just one amongst many items in a chronology; he was the single most important resource and constraint (I do not use the language of 'influences') in the making of the younger Kuhn's practice as an historian and in setting his problematic, for better and worse as it turned out.[1]

Similarly, the portions of the book on the later Kuhn are at best only preparatory to an intellectual history of the older Kuhn and Kuhnianism. This is because Marcum consistently refuses to take completely seriously Kuhn the historian, his practices and his limitations, as well as Kuhn's complex, nuanced role(s) in the evolution of post-Kuhnian views in history of science, and its related field, early post-Kuhnian sociology of scientific knowledge (hereafter SSK). This statement requires that I begin with a disclosure of interest.

I was a graduate student of Kuhn at Princeton 1969-73, followed by a year as his colleague in the HPS Program there. Like almost all the Program's graduate students I was in the 'history side' of the Program and formally a member of the Princeton History Department. In addition I was a participant, from the late 1970s in the evolution of 'post-Kuhnian' history of science (and sociology of scientific knowledge). What happened in these domains, say in the generation after about 1980, gets almost no mention.

It is striking that the only historians of natural science mentioned in any detail by Marcum are those historians of modern physics, such as Norton Wise, John Heilbron, Paul Forman, Jed Buchwald, and Peter Galison, all but the last of whom studied with Kuhn and who all kept up scholarly dialogue with and about him. The evolution of the wider field of history of science is not discussed. It is as though every time Marcum mentions HPS, he ends up focussing on the P not the H. He brushes aside the history dimension of Kuhn's Princeton years (1964-79), not mentioning his extensive teaching of historians of science. Later he embroiders this with the claim that Kuhn had no school because he had few graduate students (25-26). In fact Kuhn's Princeton years were the ones in which he did the most training of postgraduate history students in his entire career. Kuhn had intense dealings with quite a few Princeton history of science graduate students in graduate courses (called seminars at Princeton), especially through large sessional research projects carried out in those seminars. Many of those taught by him went on to successful and often influential careers in the history of science profession.[2]

At Princeton Kuhn did not conduct graduate seminars on his philosophy of science. He offered internalist, almost entirely primary source based seminars on themes like heat theory and thermodynamics, 1700-1900; or electricity and magnetism Gilbert to Maxwell. One was learning how to dissect primary sources, in the manner of Koyré, and how to construct narratives about the give and take of debate concerning theoretical and evidential claims and counter claims in small networks of expert practitioners. Interestingly, history of physics had already evolved to a sophisticated level in that very key, so that Kuhn was only one of several accomplished practitioners of that style of close internal unpacking of the ebb and flow of technical papers and debate.[3]

But there was more on offer from Kuhn for Princeton history of science students. Kuhn would often rush to the black board, improvising diagrams concerning the development and interrelations of 'traditions' (never paradigms!) in the history of the physical and experimental sciences. He was thinking out loud prior to writing his essay on 'Mathematical versus Experimental Traditions in the Development of Physical Science'. Therefore, we tended to think that Kuhn was not only showing us how to read primary sources and do close textual hermeneutics and reconstruction of local debates, but that he was also giving real time examples of how one should try to imagine longer patterns of development into which the smaller studies might fit.

Why is it important to mention Kuhn's relation to apprentice historians of science in the Princeton years? Firstly, all these people later wrote history of science themselves and had some students who also entered the field, and secondly, because this style of close blow by blow reconstruction of the negotiation of knowledge claims (from experimental outcomes to grand theories) was about to become the core subject matter of the wider domain of post-Kuhnian history and sociology of science.

Anyone who seriously practiced history of science or sociology of scientific knowledge at the time knows that the crucial breakthrough came not with the coining, at Edinburgh, of the legitimatory meta-rhetoric about 'the Strong Program', but rather through the initially paradoxical point that the central achievement of Kuhn was to conceptualize normal science, rather than to produce his contentious account of ruptural revolution. What was required -- and it was often said in history of science circles sympathetic to the Kuhn of SSR -- was this: 'how do we articulate the concept of normal science to get a richer and more accurate picture of routine scientific practice, competition and creativity?' The key, driven home by SSK scholars, was the concept of a dynamic and creative normal science, marked by tradition-bound yet tradition-modifying actions inside expert communities. The best early post-Kuhnian exponent of this point of view was Barry Barnes, then a rising star in the Edinburgh Science Studies Unit. Barnes grasped that Kuhn was concerned with understanding traditions of scientific practice, so he stressed that we learn from instances of Kuhn's early historical case studies rather than his grand modelling in SSR.

In his seminal (especially for historians) T. S. Kuhn and Social Science (1982), Barnes fleshed out the nature of a tradition of specialized scientific practice in a post-Kuhnian way, viewing normal practice within a tradition as a process of expert debate and negotiation of conceptual change, possibly small scale conceptual change. This helped shape the emergent SSK consensus that Kuhn's stark differentiation between normal and revolutionary phases in the history of a tradition of scientific practice was too strong. This view considers 'normal research' paradigms as constantly subject to partial re-negotiation and modification. If a problem can be solved only by advocating a shift in some aspect of the paradigm, however so slight, then one can say that the problem solution involves feed-back alterations to the paradigm. Such alterations are carried over into the next rounds of problem-solving where further alterations may be suggested. Of course, such bids to alter the paradigm slightly must be accepted by the relevant community. We may term a noticeable alteration of the paradigm, which has been negotiated into place, as a 'discovery'.

In this way a particular expert research culture or discipline is ongoingly changed by its own competitive dynamic of seeking and accounting discoveries, which are not mere incremental changes. If you like, every discovery of this type involves small or large consensually agreed holistic shifts in the pre-existing disciplinary culture of research of that particular field. This is, by the way, the baseline meaning of incommensurability. Other foci of post Kuhnian study in history and sociology of science dovetailed with these insights, in particular new understandings about the nature of experiment and about experimental hardware as previously consensually agreed nexuses of theory/standards and practice.

Consequently, as Stephen Shapin and others could easily note by the early 1990s, the old internalist/externalist dualism in historiography of science was transcended.[4] Each science now had a post-Kuhnian 'inside' of experts competing and playing the discovery game. Additionally, one could now examine empirically and case by case how, when and why some actors within an expert field might elect to recruit, and adapt for play inside their field, various cognitive, normative or material resources from wider domains outside that field -- whether neighboring expert fields or wider social contexts. This fruitful or what I sometimes term 'classic' version of post-Kuhnian history and sociology of science should not be mistaken for the varieties of revived, old fashioned 'externalism' -- aping the old Marxist direct social imprinting of scientific content -- rolled out today as purportedly 'Kuhnian' and preached in sub-optimal corners of 'science studies' and 'STS'.

None of what I have reported in the last five paragraphs is registered by Marcum. He does not look broadly at history of science after SSR. He certainly states that Kuhn had a very significant impact on sociology of science (201). But, rather than ask what post-Kuhnian SSK really was and what it gave to better forms of history of science, he essentially accounts post-Kuhnian sociology of scientific knowledge to have been that vaporous rhetorical phantom of 'the Strong Program' (214-216), apparently important only because it paved the way for various post-modern pastimes. For example, he has the Strong Program debouching on Feminism (218-220). Explaining this by means of the work of Evelyn Fox Keller, Marcum misses the irony (pointed out over a quarter of a century ago by Richards and Schuster) that Keller's feminist post-Kuhnianism harbors a very non-Kuhnian belief in putatively efficacious grand methods, feminine (good) and masculine (not so good), both beliefs being in fact myths explicable by garden variety classic post-Kuhnian insights.[5]

Of course these trends in history and sociology of science did not result simply from reading Kuhn. He was absorbed and re-evaluated in the light of other stimuli, for example in many cases a belated encounter with Gaston Bachelard (still largely available only in French), or with the newly available (1979) English translation of Ludwik Fleck's Genesis and Development of a Scientific Fact, the original 1935 German version of which Kuhn mentioned in the Preface to SSR. Also important for historians of science at the time was the seminal work of Jerome Ravetz. His Scientific Knowledge and its Social Problems (1971) foreshadowed the emerging SSK with a deep and rich revised heuristic model, worked out in over 200 pages, of how 'normal' science worked as a tradition-bound yet novelty and discovery producing machinery.

When it came to sociology of science, Kuhn, given his intellectual upbringing and proclivities, always adhered in the final analysis to Robert K. Merton's Parsonian functionalist views. Yet it was through attempts simultaneously to transcend both Kuhn and Merton that in the 1970s and 80s scholars such as Barnes, Shapin, R.G.A. Dolby, John Law, M.D. King and Michael Mulkay felt their way to post-Kuhnian SSK. One could also mention here the important emphasis of Pierre Bourdieu on competition in science and an economy of symbolic capital. Kuhn showed no constructive interest in any of this, much less the Schutzian interpretive and phenomenological sociology that resided deep below the efforts of some of the SSK scholars.

There are two ironies in Kuhn's trajectory that do relate directly to post-Kuhnian history and sociology of science, and neither is sighted clearly by Marcum. The first irony concerns the younger Kuhn, when he was practicing as a historian of science in the lead up to SSR. It turns out that Kuhn had hit upon elements of the later post-Kuhnian view of normal science, only to overwrite them with the grand pronouncements of SSR. In late 1961 Kuhn finished his dazzling paper on the 'Historical Structure of Scientific Discovery'.[6] What interested him was the idea that significant discoveries are not simple 'events' in which a new fact or law is slotted cumulatively into a growing edifice of scientific knowledge. Significant discoveries arise from complex historical processes and they ecologically alter the structure of knowledge through which they are produced, rather than simply adding to it. A discovery can mark an 'upheaval' of established 'theory and practice', as did the discovery of oxygen; or it can be subtle, like the effect of the discovery of Uranus upon the expectation that similar patterns of anomaly would henceforth best be handled by postulating additional planets.

Thus Kuhn came very close to what was later taken as the dynamic, and creative, nature of normal science, characteristic of post-Kuhnian thinking in history and sociology of science. But he never realized the potential of the notion of significant discovery -- and it was precisely his work on revolutionary change, growing from normal science as puzzle solving and 'mopping up' that occluded and marginalized it.[7] Marcum (44-51) discusses three of Kuhn's important immediately pre-SSR papers but not the discovery paper.[8]

This leads to the second irony, which concerns the older Kuhn. He did eventually intersect with the trajectory of post-Kuhnian history and sociology of science. Yes, the older Kuhn, like Marcum, would still stigmatize 'The Strong Program'. But the better forms of post-Kuhnian history and sociology of science had already staked out positions not a million miles from what we can glean from the older Kuhn, reading him, as usual, as a possible heuristic guide to history of science practice. His EPS and his views expressed in 'What is Wrong with Historical Philosophy of Science' can be mapped back onto some post-Kuhnian themes, provided we do not vulgarize or misunderstand what those themes were.

Kuhn's EPS with its retooled concept of incommensurability, grounded in tracing non-cumulative shifts in the 'lexicon' of an expert field -- thereby producing fission, specialization and branching evolution of scientific fields -- seems like one more version of the better sort of post-Kuhnian history and sociology of science understandings. This is especially the case when we factor in Kuhn's treatment of the 'values' (accuracy, coherent, fruitfulness etc.) deployed in 'theory choice' by disciplinary experts exercising reasonable but differential weightings and interpretations of these values. (This being yet another of his views that seeped into post-Kuhnian history and sociology of science.) Like his scholar Marcum, Kuhn missed the history and sociology boat because he was busy debating on the docks with philosophers.

Understanding Kuhn's roles in post-Kuhnian history and sociology of science enhances his gigantic stature in later twentieth century intellectual history. Kuhn's historic standing certainly does not depend on what Marcum clearly shows to be the habitual importation of vulgar versions of the younger Kuhn into any and every field you would care to mention, there providing superficial accounting resources for their endless rhetorical 'bickering' about disciplinary definition, boundaries and status. Kuhn was a great figure in our epoch of intellectual history firstly because, as Marcum documents, he sparked in philosophy of science two rounds of deep debate which have in part shaped the history of that discipline over two generations. But, Marcum ignores the processes through which Kuhn became transformative in his other two home disciplines, history and sociology of science. Here, as happens with truly significant figures, Kuhn's work was selectively and creatively woven into a greater fabric of discussion, in this case involving post-Kuhnian elucidations of the blow by blow non-incremental dynamics of scientific change and the modes of transaction between the expert insiders of traditions in their wider contexts. Like Hegel or Freud, Kuhn may not have liked what succeeding generations did in his name, but as our learned post-Kuhnian SSK colleagues have long insisted, the meaning of a discovery claim is in the hands of its subsequent users.

[Note: there are a number of errors, and typos in this work. Readers will easily spot them at pages 38, 40, 48, 58, 75 (in 1962 Charles Gillespie was Kuhn's future 'chair' at Princeton, not his 'former' one, 148 (the items 'Hull 1988 a,b' do not exist in the Bibliography), 186 201, 230.]

[1] See for example, John A. Schuster, 'The Pitfalls and Possibilities of Following Koyré: The Younger Tom Kuhn, "Critical Historian" on Tradition Dynamics and Big History', in R. Pisano and J. Agassi [eds.] Homage to Alexandre Koyré 1964-2014 (Springer, in press). 

[2] Names like Michael Mahoney, Theodore Brown, Eugene Frankel, Kenneth Caneva, Robert Sillman, Evan Melhado, Arthur Donovan, R. Stephen Turner, Harold Dorn, Arthur Quinn, Dan Serwer, Michael Gross, Bruce Wheaton, Joseph Marchese, Toby Appel, James McClellan, Stewart Gillmor, Elizabeth Fee, John Lesch, John Forrester, Wise and Ian Langham come to mind. Only a very few of these individuals had Kuhn as chief dissertation supervisor. It was a commonplace in the Program that one was better off studying with Kuhn but having Charles Gillespie for one's official dissertation supervisor, perhaps with Kuhn in a supporting role. The same point held later, substituting Mahoney as supervisor with Kuhn still as deputy(as in my case) or Gerald Geison who had not been a student of Kuhn but was then a young historian of science on the Program faculty much involved in post-Kuhnian thinking about how to practice history of science and use the emergent post-Kuhnian SSK.

[3] Consider the work of Heilbron, Martin Klein, Stanley Goldberg, Russell McCormmach, Stephen Brush, Erwin Hiebert, Forman, Hans Kangro and others, members of Kuhn's or the next generation. I and fellow history of science students not in this sub-specialty sometimes dubbed it 'the history of physics mafia'. Kuhn was not the sole member.

[4] Steven Shapin, 'Discipline and Bounding: The History and Sociology of Science as Seen through the Externalism-Internalism Debate', History of Science 30 (1992): 333-369.

[5] Evelleen Richards and John A. Schuster. (1989) 'The Myth of Feminine Method: A Challenge for Gender Studies and the Social Studies of Science', Social Studies of Science 19: 697-720.

[6] Originally published in Science 136 (1962):760-64 and then as Chapter 7 in The Essential Tension (1977).

[7] I made points like this about the discovery paper, and related ones about Kuhn's other lost opportunities regarding emergent SSK, as early as 1979: John Schuster, 'Kuhn and Lakatos Revisited' British Journal for the History of Science 12: 301-317.

[8] Similarly, while Marcum does discuss the important paper on 'The Function of Measurement in Physical Science', he does not see that it too foreshadowed, and in part influenced, the efflorescence of post-Kuhnian history of science and SSK concentration on the micro-politics of experimentation.