Thomas Reid's Theory of Perception

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Ryan Nichols, Thomas Reid's Theory of Perception, Oxford University Press, 2007, 301pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199276919.

Reviewed by Todd Buras, Baylor University


Ryan Nichols has written the first book-length analysis of Reid's account of perception in English in at least a century.[1]  For this reason alone, the book is a welcome addition to the emerging body of Reid scholarship.  Nichols's book is also the first to have at its disposal critical editions of Reid's key works on perception (thanks to the Edinburgh Edition of Thomas Reid, edited by Knud Haakonssen), as well as a catalogued collection of Reid's unpublished manuscripts (thanks to the Reid Project at the University of Aberdeen).  Nichols takes full advantage of these resources.  He writes with a comprehensive grasp of the primary sources and brings a host of important unpublished passages to bear on the discussion for the first time.  But the modern scholarly mill has only begun to churn through Reid's texts, and it shows in Nichols's analysis.  There is plenty of chaff in with the wheat, here.  I make a first pass at separating the two, after a quick overview of Nichols's discussion.

The book contains ten chapters.  One pair (Chapters 1 and 10) addresses the method behind Reid's theory.  A second pair (Chapters 3 and 4) analyzes the arguments motivating Reid's account of the basic structure of perception.  The remaining chapters probe the extent to which Reid's basic claims about perception are qualified by his treatment of more complicated perceptual phenomena.  The complicated phenomena include:  the perception of visible figure (Chapter 4), our awareness of sensations and their function in perception (Chapters 7 and 5), the differences between original and acquired perception, and the perception of primary and secondary qualities (Chapters 8 and 6), and, lastly, Reid's treatment of Molyneux-type questions (Chapter 9).  In general, Nichols's Reid is an empiricist who never strays far from attentive observation and careful classification.  The result is an account of perception that, on the whole, minimizes the role objects within the mind (sensations) play in the perception of objects without, yet resists the Procrustean inclinations of highly unified theories.

The chapters addressing Reid's methodology are rather freestanding -- and it is a good thing, too.  For they present a self-consciously lopsided view of Reid's approach.  Nichols calls Reid's appeals to common sense "the fulcrum upon which the worst interpretations of his corpus swings."  Rather than identifying what is important and defensible in Reid's allegiance to common sense, Nichols instead opts for "stating his theories in ways that minimally play upon his appeal to common sense" (21).  At the center of Reid's method, according to Nichols, is Newtonianism, which amounts to induction on careful observation, together with a healthy distaste for hypotheses (15-18).  Having turned a blind eye toward Reid's commitment to common sense, Nichols then notes how hard it is to explain his dualism, and claims that Reid simply fails to notice the tension between his dualism and his commitment to sound empirical principles (37).  Nichols even suggests that Reid's commitment to dualism results from an unwillingness to submit his religious beliefs to a proper philosophical investigation (32).

Once the blinders are removed, the basis of Reid's dualism requires no unflattering speculation.  Reid's claims to the mantle of Newton are, no doubt, central to his philosophical method.  But they are not his whole methodological story.  Reid is nothing if not a common sense philosopher.  Newtonianism unmoored from common sense is simply not Reid's Newtonianism.  Philosophical theories must not only answer before the tribunal of empirical observation, they must also answer to the principles of common sense.  As Nichols notes (36), the basic tenets of Reid's dualism fall directly out of his most explicit catalogue of the principles of common sense.  There is no question, then, about the roots of Reid's dualism.  Nor does his dualism sit uneasily with the full account of his method.  There are, to be sure, important questions about the consistency of Reid's Newtonian and Common Sense commitments, as well as the bearing of each on dualism.  But these questions are sequestered by Nichols's neglect of Reid's commitment to common sense.

The chapters addressing Reid's arguments also require serious sifting.  Both of the arguments Nichols engages concern the nature of the acts of conception which are partly constitutive of perception for Reid.  Reidian conceptions are the mental acts by virtue of which thoughts (in our case, perceptual thoughts) are directed at objects (in our case, presently existing mind-independent objects).  The first argument, which Nichols dubs the "Blind Book Argument," aims to establish that the intentional properties of conceptions are primitive.[2]  Nichols has Reid arriving at this conclusion by a reductio of the supposition -- which Reid allegedly finds in Hume -- that the intentional properties of conceptions are analyzable in terms of their relation to non-intentional states.  The supposition requires some arrangement of states that is not about anything to result in a state that is about something.  Reid recognizes the absurdity of this position, according to Nichols, when he claims "Symbols without interpretation have no value" (quoted on 58).  A mind given only non-intentional states, says Reid, would be like a savage "who has never heard of the use of letters" given a book.  Neither would recognize that they are dealing with symbols, much less what they signify.  Just as the book would be meaningless to the savage, so the arrangement of non-intentional states would be meaningless to the mind we are imagining.  Reid takes it to be obvious that our own mental states are not meaningless, and thus finds the conclusion absurd.

Reid certainly says symbols without interpretation have no value, and he clearly takes this to be relevant to his critique of the way of ideas.  But it is not at all clear that Reid sees Hume as trying to derive intentional from non-intentional states, and therefore not at all clear that reducing this effort to absurdity is the point of Reid's remarks.  The passages Nichols quotes are consistent with a much weaker reading, according to which Reid is not engaging Hume on the origin of intentionality, but on the origin of intentional relations to non-mental objects.  Nichols quotes Reid as saying that, according to Hume's principles, "we can have no idea of anything but our sensations" (quoted on 57).  Similarly, he quotes Hume as saying it is evident that "our senses offer not their impressions as the images of something distinct" (quoted on 54).  It is a long way from the claim that impressions represent nothing distinct to the claim that they represent nothing, and equally far from the claim that we can have no idea of anything other than sensations to the claim that we can have no idea of anything.  Nichols does nothing to close the gap.  He does note that some scholars understand Hume's project in the stronger terms (50, n. 3, 68).  But the evidence that Reid does so is, at best, indecisive.

The other argument driving Nichols's interpretation is what he calls the "Sensory Deprivation Argument."  This argument attempts to establish that the acts of conception involved in the perception of primary qualities cannot be acquired by any amount of reflection, reasoning, or habituation on any combination of sensations.  The target here is not reductionism about intentionality, but sensationalism about conceptual content -- the idea that our concepts present or describe things other than sensations solely in terms of their relation to sensations.  Reid believes that in perception we employ concepts that present or describe bodily qualities as they are in themselves, independently of their relation to our sensations (or anything else).  His favorite example is the concept of hardness, which he takes to present its object as the firm adhesion of the parts of a body.  He contrasts this with our concept of a rose's fragrance, which he takes to describe its object, roughly, as the unknown quality of a body that produces a known range of olfactory sensations.  He takes the Way of Ideas to be committed to sensationalism, and challenges its defenders to produce our concept of hardness by reasoning and reflection on sensations.  He explains, by means of thought experiments, why he believes sensationalism is not up to the task, and concludes that the formation of concepts like hardness is inexplicable apart from the principles of the constitution of our nature.

Nichols once again casts new light on the argument through his examination of important unpublished manuscripts.  But where he read too much into the manuscripts pertaining to the Blind Book Argument, he does not read enough into the manuscripts pertaining to this argument.  Nichols actually thinks Reid concedes in his manuscripts that the subject of his thought experiments could form one of the disputed concepts, i.e., motion (105).  Nichols then ponders why Reid's published comments are so much more sanguine about the argument than his manuscripts.  What Reid actually says in the crucial manuscript, however, is that, although the subject of the experiment could form a concept of motion, "it is certainly extremely different from our notion of motion for it would include no notion of space or change of place" (quoted on 104).  Now this is either an indication that Reid privately concedes the inadequacy of his own argument, or an indication of how Reid understands the point of his own argument.  Interpreted in the later vein, forming a concept of motion is not the point of the challenge; forming our concept is.  Reid is granting that by reasoning and reflection on sensations, we can form a concept of motion.  He may even grant that the sensational concept of motion applies to all and only the same cases as our concept.  Does it follow that the sensational concept of motion is our concept?  Not unless extensional equivalence among concepts is equivalence simpliciter.  It is not -- as Russell's example of human being and featherless-biped that is not a plucked chicken memorably shows.  Something in our concept of motion is missing from the sensationalist's substitute, and Reid tells us what it is:  space, an external reality which we conceive of independently of its relation to our sensations.  Nichols leaves this more charitable interpretive possibility completely unexplored.[3]

The picture of perception that Nichols presents on the basis of these arguments is less objectionable than his understanding of the arguments themselves.  Taken together, Nichols observes, the two arguments narrowly circumscribe the role sensations play in Reid's account of perception.  The Blind Book Argument rules out any analysis of the intentionality of perception in terms of its relation to sensations, which Nichols takes to be a prime example of non-intentional states (83-85).  Although Nichols has his doubts about its success, the Sensory Deprivation Argument shows that Reid takes at least some of the conceptions involved in perception to be acquired without reasoning and reflection on sensations.  For Reid, Nichols rightly notes, sensations merely suggest the mental acts (conception and belief) constitutive of perception.  By this Reid means that sensations are contingently correlated with perception by the original principles of our constitution.  Sensations are simply followed in a law-like way by acts of conception and belief, the content of which is, in the most basic cases, completely unrelated to the sensations which precede them.

The six chapters examining the extent to which these basic commitments are nuanced to accommodate more complex aspects of perception are, in my judgment, the book's most significant contribution.  Each chapter offers Reid scholars a philosophically sophisticated and textually well-grounded answer to an important interpretive question.  Though Nichols's answers are often contentious, his discussion moves our understanding forward.  I conclude with one example.

In Chapter 7, Nichols tackles the question of our awareness of the sensations lodged in the middle of the perceptual process by the principles of our constitution.  As Nichols notes, this is a watershed question.  A 'yes' answer implies that there are mediating objects of thought in perception.  Nichols defends the majority opinion, arguing that we are not aware of sensations -- and not simply because sensations are typically unattended objects of thought, but because they are not objects of thought at all.  As far as I know, Nichols is the first to answer the textual evidence to the contrary.[4]  He grapples at some length with a passage in which Reid says, flatly, that perception by means of signs (i.e., sensations) involves "two objects of thought" (196-199).  He is equally concerned about Reid's claim that sensations involve conceptions (199-202; see also 44, and 83-85).  For, as I have argued, in the context of Reid's thought, this claim is evidence that sensations take themselves as objects.[5]  Nichols's response to the first point is that the recalcitrant passage should be discounted, because it "occurs far from Reid's central discussion of sensation," and in a context where strict consistency with Reid's mature views is not to be expected (197-198).  To the second issue, Nichols suggests that Reid does not use "conception" univocally, and that by differentiating Reid's uses we can see how sensations may involve conceptions without involving objects of thought (201, also 44).  I take Reid to mean what he says in these passages, and see nothing other than the majority opinion to motivate these interpretive expedients.  But one does not have to accept Nichols's interpretations in order to appreciate the significance of his contribution.  The discussion is pushed forward by his detailed and systematically inter-related answers to watershed questions.  He brings the costs and benefits of the major interpretive decisions more clearly into view.  This is no small accomplishment, especially for the first book in a growing field of inquiry.

[1] Several book-length studies of Reid's thought devote considerable space to his account of perception, but do so as part of a broader overview of his philosophy.  In this category belongs:  Keith Lehrer, Thomas Reid, Routledge, 1989; Roger Gallie, Thomas Reid and 'The Way of Ideas,' Kluwer, 1989; and, more recently, Nicholas Wolterstorff, Thomas Reid and the Story of Epistemology, Cambridge University Press, 2001.  Other works have focused on perception, but only on a single aspect, as the following titles indicate:  Norman Daniels, Thomas Reid's 'Inquiry':  The Geometry of Visibles and the Case for Realism, Stanford University Press, 1989; Philip de Bary, Thomas Reid and Scepticism:  His Reliabilist Response, Routledge, 2002.

[2] Nichols never explains how this commitment to primitive intentional relations is consistent with his preferred interpretation of Reid's method.  Yet an explanation is called for.  Nichols's preferred interpretation of Reid's method renders Reid's opposition to materialist accounts of the mind prejudicial (32), and commits Reid to an account that keeps the mind "inside the realm of science" (37).  Primitive intentional relations are neither obviously less opposed to materialist accounts of the mind nor more within the realm of science than Reid's substance dualism. 

[3] I sketch this interpretation in "The Problem with Reid's Direct Realism," Philosophical Quarterly 52 (2002):  469-471; reprinted in John Haldane and Stephen Read, eds., The Philosophy of Thomas Reid:  A Collection of Essays, Blackwell, 2003.  I develop and defend the interpretation in "Reid's Experimentum Crucis," unpublished manuscript.

[4] I present this evidence in "The Nature of Sensation in Reid," History of Philosophy Quarterly 22 (2005):  221-238.

[5] Where there are conceptions, there are objects of thought.  Sensations involve conceptions, and therefore objects of thought.  Reid's official definition of sensation prevents sensations from having objects of thought distinct from themselves.  Hence they must have objects that are not distinct from themselves.  See "The Nature of Sensations in Reid," 223-224.