Thought, Reference, and Experience: Themes From the Philosophy of Gareth Evans

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José Luis Bermudez (ed.), Thought, Reference, and Experience: Themes From the Philosophy of Gareth Evans, Oxford, 2005, 325 pp, $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199248966.

Reviewed by David Smith, University of Sussex


This volume consists of a long introduction by the editor, which gives an informed and helpful overview both of the work of Gareth Evans and the essays contained in the volume, together with nine essays exploring issues that Evans himself had written on. Although, reasonably enough, all the contributors are more or less sympathetic to Evans’s general philosophical position, with but one exception the essays are critical of Evans’s views.

In the first paper in the collection John McDowell rehearses and reinforces Evans’s claim that Fregean sense ought not to be attributed to empty names. The claim is not that Frege actually subscribed to this view; nor is it just that we get a better theory if we do accept this thesis. It is, rather, that there are elements in Frege’s own stated views that push in this direction, so that his overall position is internally conflicted. McDowell presents as good a case for this as can, I think, be given. In the following paper Mark Sainsbury argues that the kind of truth-theory that Evans regarded as capable of serving as a theory of meaning for a language is in conflict with Evans’s recognition of both ordinary and descriptive names in language. Evans wanted to treat both ordinary proper names and descriptive names as genuine referring expressions. (A descriptive name is one that names whatever it is that satisfies a certain description. Evans’s own example was “Julius”: a name introduced for whoever invented the zip.) In a truth-theory for a language both types of expression would be handled by base clauses employing the notion of reference. Nevertheless, these two sorts of referring expressions behave semantically in different ways, because whereas, according to Evans, ordinary proper names cannot be meaningful if they are empty (i.e., they are Russellian), descriptive names can be. So the clause for a descriptive name cannot precisely mirror one for an ordinary name (such as “‘Hesperus’ refers to Hesperus”), but must have the following form: “For all x (‘Julius’ refers to x iff x = Julius)”. This latter sort of clause requires a free logic for its interpretation, since “Julius” is not just mentioned but used (and Evans employed in particular a negative free logic, which counts all atomic sentences containing empty names as false). So far, both the similarity and the difference between ordinary and descriptive names are captured by the respective semantic clauses. However, Sainsbury complains, the difference evaporates when we turn from the base clauses of a truth-theory to its theorems. Both types of base clause will deliver theorems such as “‘NN is F’ is true iff NN is F”; and because such theorems are not atomic, they can be true even though the names involved are empty. This, of course, is how things should be if we have possibly empty descriptive names in our object-language; but it does mean that the Russellian status of ordinary names is not reflected in the theorems of a truth-theory. The crucial point now is that a truth-theory functions as a possible interpretation of a language only because of its theorems and how well they reflect linguistic practice. Hence, Sainsbury concludes, “The existence assumption characteristic of a Russellian name does not surface in interpretation”. Sainsbury proposes a modified truth-theory that incorporates something analogous to scope indication for names. Ordinary and descriptive names feature in different kinds of theorems because the former always receive a wide-scope interpretation and the latter a narrow-scope one. In a final section Sainsbury wonders why Evans supposes that proper names have to be either Russellian or descriptive (his own view being that they are neither). His diagnosis is that this is because of a lingering internalism in Evans’s position.

Evans held that the notion of a referring expression picked out a unitary semantical kind. All members of this kind make the same sort of contribution to the truth-conditions of sentences in which they can feature. The kind includes such expressions as ordinary proper names, descriptive names, demonstratives and some pronouns, but, importantly, does not include definite descriptions. At one point in the Varieties of Reference Evans states that he has omitted to deal with the issue of plural reference; and elsewhere he states that for the purposes of this work he is treating the notions of a referring expression and of a singular term as equivalent. Ian Rumfitt addresses this lacuna, and asks whether any plural terms should be admitted into the semantical kind referring expression. The sorts of plural term Rumfitt has in mind are collective proper names (such as “The Channel Islands”), plural demonstratives (“those men”), certain plural pronouns (“we”), and various compounds of (singular and plural) terms (such as “William and Mary” and “those men and I”). Rumfitt makes out a convincing case for indeed treating them as genuinely referential. As I said above, Evans excluded definite descriptions from the category of referring expression. His reason for doing this was their behaviour in modal contexts. Given this, the crucial test, as far as Evans would be concerned, for Rumfitt’s proposal will be this modal issue. In particular, such plural terms need to be rigid if they are to count as referring expressions. Although Rumfitt does address this issue at the end of his paper, I would have liked a more extended discussion of this crucial issue, if only because one of his claims in this connection—that it is metaphysically impossible that an island should have been located significantly differently from where it is actually located—is far from initially plausible.

Evans devoted two long papers to the subject of (non-demonstrative) pronouns, and this is the subject of a paper by Ken Safir. The issues here are too complex to go into, so I shall mention just the two major points that emerge from Safir’s paper. Evans opposed the approach of Lasnik, who had suggested that we should not look for rules that determine how pronouns are to be construed, since this is a matter of extra-semantic pragmatic and contextual features. Such construals are generally semantically unenforced, though there are certain principles that exclude certain readings. Evans, by contrast, sought certain interpretative rules in this area, and principles that explain exceptions. Safir essentially moves back closer to Lasnik’s position. Secondly, discussions of pronouns usually focus on the notion of coreference. Lasnik displaces this from the focus of attention, and replaces it with his notion of coconstrual. A pronoun can be construed (i.e. have its reference determined) with respect to some noun phrase without the pronoun having the same reference as that noun phrase. An example Safir uses to bring this out is that of what he calls “proxy” readings of pronouns. In the sentence "As they strolled through the wax museum Fidel thought that he would look better in a uniform", the italicised “he” is to be interpreted (coconstrued) in the light of the preceding occurrence of “Fidel”, but the two are not necessarily coreferential, since the pronoun may refer to a waxwork model of Fidel.

In the following paper José Luis Bermudez discusses the sense of the first-person pronoun. Frege had claimed that one is presented with oneself in a way that is unique, and that this gives the term “I” a unique incommunicable sense for each of us. Evans endorses this idea, and spells it out in terms of how the sense of “I” is tied to ways that we acquire information about ourselves in a way that is unparalleled by the way we acquire information about any other object. Such “privileged” information channels are not subject to error through misidentification. Each of us has channels of information that can only be information (possibly misinformation) about ourselves. This is not the whole of Evans’s story about the sense of “I”, but it is an essential component of it. Bermudez objects to this “Fregean” component by claiming that it conflicts with what he terms the symmetry constraint. A thought I might express by saying “I am F” is, according to this constraint, the same as one you could, in suitable circumstances, have expressed by saying “You are F”. Since you cannot possibly have the same sort of informational channel related to me as I myself have, the constraint is flouted by any account, such as Evans’s, on which the sense of “I” for each person reflects the privileged informational link each person has with himself. Bermudez suggests that we simply drop this component from our account of the sense of “I”. He does not deny that there are such privileged sources of information; but he suggests that they contribute to our grasp of some of the predicates that we can apply to ourselves rather than to the concept of ourselves as such. I have a privileged way of telling that I am in pain; but this contributes to my understanding of pain, not of “I”.

Evans claimed that the spatial concepts that we exercise on the basis of how things look to us are identical to the concepts that we exercise on the basis of how things feel to us. These two sensory modalities furnish us with identical, not modality-specific, concepts. But if our spatial concepts are determined by how the world spatially appears to us in perception—by the non-conceptual, phenomenal content of perception—how can this be? For visual and tactile perceptions are phenomenally quite different from one another. This is a version of “Molyneux’s Problem”. Evans argued against the suggestion that we have different visual and tactile spatial concepts by tying the content of spatial concepts to ways of thinking about space and things in space egocentrically—or to “egocentric space”. Evans identifies egocentric space with behavioural space. Since each of us has a single behavioural space, a single set of spatial concepts is thereby grounded. In his contribution to this volume John Campbell contests this account. He does not deny that Evans’s claim that we have a unitary set of spatial concepts is correct; however he does dispute that Evans has argued for it cogently. Campbell’s objection to Evans is fundamentally twofold. First, the role given to behaviour in Evans’s account reduces spatial properties to something like Gibsonian affordances, whereas they are the categorical bases of such affordances. Secondly, Evans fails to distinguish, indeed conflates, non-conceptual phenomenal content with the content of sub-personal informational states. The former is supposed to be unitary for vision and touch with respect to spatial content, and so to give rise to unitary spatial concepts. But sub-personal informational states may be modular, embodying spatial information in quite different ways. So when such content surfaces in consciousness, becoming phenomenal content, there is no reason why it should be “transparent” to the subject that two states, in different modalities, that contain the same non-conceptual information, indeed have that same content. Such non-conceptual content will not therefore sustain unitary, genuinely conceptual content across sensory modalities, since conceptual content must meet the “Intuitive Difference Criterion”—i.e., be transparent to the subject.

In the following paper Christopher Peacocke explores what is involved in possessing the concept of perceptual experience. When you see that p, you can, he claims, move with justification to the self-ascriptive judgement I see that p. When you make such a move, Peacocke says that you are following the Core Rule for vision; and there are analogous rules for the other sense modalities. Following such a rule does not require prior possession of the concept of seeing-that; the transition is not from a judgement that one is seeing that p, but from the state of seeing that p itself. Following the rule does, however, involve knowing what it is like to see. According to Peacocke, to know what it is like to be in a certain state is to possess a capacity to recognise that one is in that state on the basis of being in that state; but that is just what one does when following a Core Rule. A Core Rule also has a negative component, which warrants the move from not seeing that p to the judgement that one does not see that p. There is also an extension of the Core Rule, which licenses the move from being in a state indistinguishable from seeing that p to the judgement that one has the visual experience as of p‘s being the case. Following a Core Rule for a certain sense modality is, Peacocke claims, one requirement for possession of the concept of perceptual experience in that modality. This account contrasts with one that Evans had given. In pointing out the contrast Peacocke argues for various shortcomings in Evans’s proposal. Finally, Peacocke extends his account to the domain of action.

In the most Kantian (or perhaps Strawsonian) of his works—“Things Without the Mind”—Evans argued that the idea of space is, necessarily, implicitly involved in the very idea of an objective world: that is to say, of a world in which things can exist unperceived. In his contribution to this volume Quassim Cassam raises various problems for this claim, and substitutes his own (weaker) thesis: that perception (as of) of a spatial domain (rather than spatial concepts) is necessary for objective experience—i.e., experience that is (as of) an objective world.

The collection ends with a paper by E. J. Lowe on Evans’s very short but influential paper on vague objects. Is it possible for it to be indeterminate whether objects a and b are identical? Evans argued not. For if it were, a would have the property of being indeterminately identical to b. But b lacks this property: b is definitely identical to b. So the two cannot be indeterminately identical. Lowe argues that Evans’s argument is both subtly question-begging and invalid. The most important claim that Lowe makes in this connection is that we must distinguish the property of being self-identical from the property of being identical to a, even when a is the subject of predication. Lowe suggests that this point invalidates not only Evans’s argument concerning vague objects, but also the influential demonstration that all identity statements involving rigid terms are necessary.

This brief account of the essays in this volume does not do justice to the high quality and depth of argumentation to be found in these essays. They each make a significant contribution to the literature. Evans was a highly critical person. But I think he would have been gratified by this collection of essays in his honour.