Three Faces of Desire

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Timothy Schroeder, Three Faces of Desire, Oxford University Press, 2004, 224pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 019517237X.

Reviewed by Leonard D. Katz, Massachusetts Institute of Technology


In this ambitious, informative, and very often insightful book, Timothy Schroeder relies on his up-to-date reading of the neuroscience literature in formulating accounts of intrinsic (and thus, for him) standing desire and also of pleasure. His discussion of the neurobiology of appetitive motivation will reward any reader interested in how voluntary action is organized in vertebrate brains. The book is also noteworthy for its attempt to carry the representationalist program in the philosophy of mind, in a version inspired by his dissertation advisor Fred Dretske, beyond sense perception and cognition, into areas more likely to test its limits.

Here, however, his saying that pleasure is sensing an increase in the net coming to pass of what one desires seems arbitrary, even given his view of its neuroscience. The scientifically much better supported simple linear 'feedforward' model of action selection should be taken as a good early shot at the moving target offered by the fast-developing neuroscience of motivation. With these caveats, expanded upon below, Schroeder's close following of this important science and his concise, readable, and usually reliable exposition sets an example for other young philosophers. For the reader who aspires to understand or contribute to similar discussions on the borders of the philosophy of mind, moral psychology, and neuroscience, this book is a good place to start, although it must be taken with the full measure of salt that interpretations of emerging science require and its bolder generalizations and major claims are often questionable. (The psychologist Daniel Nettle's broader-market Happiness: The Science behind Your Smile [Oxford, 2005] offers a more accessible, comprehensive, and balanced introductory review of the current state of that science; on the role of serotonin, for example, it provides a much-needed complement to Schroeder's deep but narrow focus on literatures he interprets as supporting his theses.)

The title's 'three faces of desire' are its connections with action, pleasure, and reward, with "reward" used mainly in the experimental psychologist's sense of a cause of reinforcement (of the tendency to behave similarly to very recently, in similar circumstances, in the future), unattested by the OED before twentieth-century behaviorism. The distinction is blurred, however, when Schroeder, while rejecting behaviorism for a representationalist view of mind, maintains that an understanding of the automaticity of reinforcement conditioning, which requires no foresight or awareness, was already contained in common sense and its ordinary concept of reward (42-43, 52, 63, 119). It seems, though, that the ordinary concept of reward finds purchase only where some notion of desert, or at least of consciously instrumental work toward some goal, does and that common sense regards rewards as changing future behavior only through conscious expectations of similar future rewards' depending on similar behavior. Equating these senses matters because, when combined with the assumption that ordinary-language terms may refer to natural kinds whose necessary natures remain to be discovered (6-8), it enables the reasoning that if reinforcement learning theory reveals the nature of reward (in its reinforcement sense), but reward (in its ordinary sense) consists in being given something one desires, then reinforcement learning theory will reveal also the nature of desire, Schroeder's principal quarry (67-70).

The three faces of desire are taken to suggest three (kinds of) theories about its nature. First considered is the tendency in late twentieth-century analytic philosophy to characterize desire by way of its role in motivating action. This is rejected for several reasons, most strongly on the ground that this role is not sufficient to distinguish desire from intentions and habits, since these also motivate action. This approach also fails to respect the everyday felt difference between appetitive motivation, linked to pleasure, and aversive motivation, linked to its opposite, 'displeasure'.

Next come hedonic theories of desire, which emphasize this distinction, accounting for action in terms of pleasure and displeasure. These are rejected, less persuasively, mainly on neuroscientific grounds (on which more later), but initially on the author's intuition that in minor (presumably subclinical) depression pleasure fades more than desire. Work here is done by the seemingly harmless early limitation of the inquiry's scope to intrinsic (as opposed to instrumental) desires (5), which is later understood as involving a restriction to stable standing desires, as opposed to occurrent ones.

The full import of this restriction becomes explicit only late in the book (150-52, 172), where even desires for food, which figured as paradigm examples of desires (5), turn out to be only instrumental desires, because they vary with appetite, supposedly serving standing unconscious intrinsic desires for homeostasis localized in the hypothalamic nuclei that monitor blood sugar, salt, and so on and act so as to regulate the levels of these, having as their objects the physiological set-points they keep the body near. But surely it is a stretch to say that this homeostasis is all a hungry child reaching for a roll wants for its own sake, and that it wants to eat the roll only as a means to this. A plausible account of subpersonal states' biological function, of answering to physiological needs, is stretched to serve also in an account of what is wanted for its own sake -- and later in accounts of a person's pleasure and interest (173) as well.

Schroeder argues against hedonic theories of desire that pleasure may be much diminished by depression or satiety, when we do not regard the person's more permanent standing preferences or affections as diminished to the same degree (31-32). Similarly, an argument against hedonic accounts of reward depends on the assumption that pleasure is always conscious, whereas reinforcement is often not (60-61). Indeed, close to the book's end, in the seventeenth of the claims conjoined and name-branded 'the reward theory' (168-72), we are told that desires are never themselves conscious, for all the early emphasis on the phenomenology of desire and of appetite's contrast with aversion (10, 26-27). (This presumably could serve as yet another argument against 'the hedonic theory of desire'.) But hedonic motivation theorists had occurrent, not standing, desires foremost in mind and presumably thought that standing desires are made such by, and discovered by way of, their connections with occurrent ones, oppositely to Schroeder's procedure. Most importantly, the better hedonic theorists, such as Moritz Schlick, explain action by one's present pleasure in future prospects, selfish and unselfish alike -- rather than by desires or dispositions to later oneself feel pleasure upon what one desires coming to pass, as do the versions foregrounded by Schroeder, who accordingly argues 'the hedonic theory' slides into egoism (34, 35) in eliminating this supposedly last alternative to his preferred approach (100).

Schroeder retains the appetite/aversion structure typical of hedonic theories, but differs from them (following neuroscientists, especially Kent Berridge) by making motivational and cognitive focusing the effects of a neural reward signal dissociable from pleasure. His distinctive claims are that it is following the rules for providing a reinforcement signal (such as reinforcement learning theory tells us is suited to form future desires) that makes a signal a reward signal, that the objects whose representations tend to contribute toward such signals count as rewards, and that it is mental representations of these, when they have the capacity to continue to send such reward signals independently of their continued association with representations of other objects, that are our intrinsic desires. (All else, including short-term effects on cognition and motivation, and connection to pleasure, is inessential to being one.)

The task of discovering the precise essence or nature of reward is officially deferred to still-evolving mathematical theories of reinforcement learning (61-62, 168). Schroeder, however, believes we already know enough about the neural organization of learning, motivation, and affect to ascertain where the standing desires and the reward systems that (on his view) they as such feed into are in our brains, their causal priority to pleasure and action, and the relative causal independence of pleasure and action from each other. Since these bold claims and the evidence supporting them are scientific, discussing them will require scientific vocabulary and reference to the scientific literature.

On Schroeder's simple model, cortical representations of external objects, involving the orbitofrontal cortex (OFC), and representations of one's physiological proximity to homeostatic set-points, in the lateral hypothalamus, are standing intrinsic desires in virtue of their capacity (when appropriately activated) to produce other desires by reinforcement, which they do by sending signals to dopamine cells in the midbrain, which in turn produce a general and widespread reward signal. This produces new standing desires, selects appropriate current action through interactions with other neural signals in the striatum (a model of which Schroeder well describes), helps form motor habits through longer-term learning there, too, and has similarly directive effects on our thoughts, as well. This picture is scientifically well supported, at least to a first approximation, whatever one thinks of the use of "desires" criticized four paragraphs above.

Pleasure, we are told (without similarly strong scientific evidence), is 'normally' caused by the dopamine signal reaching also the perigenual anterior cingulate cortex (PGAC), 'the seat of pleasure' on Schroeder's view. Pleasure thus represents increase (above prior expectation) in net intrinsic desire satisfaction (that is, for Schroeder, the coming to pass of what is represented by stable neural representations poised to activate the reinforcement-based acquisition of others similarly poised) and is a conscious sensing of this. However, the dopamine signal's information (whence PGAC activity's representational content is supposed to derive) is actually much more mixed, as Schroeder earlier explains, signaling both unpredicted present reward and newly predicted future reward -- and, one may add, novelty and uncertainty, too. And 14 percent of the midbrain dopamine neurons fire to aversive stimuli, such as pain -- at least so long as there seems a prospect of controlling it (Simona Cabib and Stefano Puglisi-Allegra, "Opposite Responses of Mesolimbic Dopamine Neurons to Controllable and Uncontrollable Aversive Experiences," The Journal of Neuroscience, 2004, 14(5): 3333-40). So far, it seems, dopamine signals represent increased behavioral opportunity or challenge more than Schroeder's net increase in what one ultimately desires coming about. He handles pleasure in imagination and recollection as misrepresentation of that (101-2). Pleasure that arrives fully expected and being in a pleasantly relaxed mood, which still worse fit the dopamine signaling story and the associated representational account of all pleasure, are not discussed. There is thus little reason to accept Schroeder's claim about what all pleasure as such represents, even if its 'home' is in the PGAC.

That pleasure is uniquely situated in the PGAC, rather than instead or equally in other regions showing up similarly in brain imaging studies, is not well supported by Schroeder's citation of studies, selected from a large literature, showing results for varying cingulate loci and many other correlations besides. Since we are not told just where in the PGAC his disjoint, but adjacent, seats of all pleasure and of all displeasure are to be found, precise appraisal is impossible. Consulting the scientific works cited for "assertions" of this view (76) reveals, to this reviewer's reading, neither assertion of, nor precise development of, nor marked preference for such a view. Brent Vogt, in a more recent review than that Schroeder cites, suggests different localization of fear, sadness, and pain affect: "Pain and Emotion Interactions in Subregions of the Cingulate Gyrus," Nature Reviews Neuroscience, 2005, 6:533-44. And as the Whalen et al. 1998 paper cited there (76) suggests, precise correlation, even if shown, need not indicate function; some cingulate areas seem involved more in regulating affect, than in its experience, just as not all analgesia systems responding to pain need be involved in experiencing it. A recent study of humans with cingulate lesions (Hornak et al., "Changes in emotion after circumscribed surgical lesions of the orbitofrontal and cingulated cortices," Brain , 2003, 126:1691-1712), indeed, shows affective instability, sometimes involving both more positive and more negative affect, rather than lack of all affect (as Schroeder suggests, going on older literature, on his account showing diminished pain affect for small lesions and gross affective deficits for very large, nonspecific frontal lobotomies, which severed connections wholesale). While Schroeder cites some studies conflicting with his thesis, he repeatedly asserts it and relies on it as a premise, proclaiming it 'dominant' (80), which it is not; it may be his own speculative synthesis, more than he intends. (Methods for finding the overall tendencies of data from large numbers of overlapping and conflicting studies require taking into account all relevant studies; this prevents unconsciously selecting or recollecting according to one's theoretical bias.) Still, areas of the cingulate likely play important roles in affective experience, as Richard D. Lane, among others, also has proposed, suggesting the dorsal anterior cingulate for phenomenal experience, and the ventral for reflective awareness ("Neural Correlates of Conscious Emotional Experience," in Cognitive Neuroscience of Emotion, 2000).

Pleasure, Schroeder also tells us, has no more power to motivate action than any other sensory system does because the PGAC (its 'seat', on his view) lacks the direct influence on action through the dorsal motor striatum that midbrain dopamine cells (and through these, his supposed intrinsic desire representations) possess. Detailed functional neuroanatomy is not yet complete; however, even if Schroeder's claim for pleasure's localization and lack of such direct connections are accepted, other PGAC connections, such as those to and through the motivationally weighty ventral striatum, may outweigh this lack. While leading scientific theorists, including Kent Berridge and Bernard Balleine, sometimes place pleasure predominantly upstream from reinforcement (oppositely from Schroeder), pleasure and action may not be organized in the brain in any such simple, linear 'feedforward' way, but often or always through recurrent, 'loopy', processing, in part through reentrant cortical-striatal-cortical loops (perhaps overlapping so that motivational/emotional cingulate loops can influence motor loops, to use an idea of Suzanne Haber's), with which further circuits, including those containing the midbrain dopamine projections, interact. Such recurrent processing has been plausibly argued by Victor Lamme to be necessary for all conscious experience, such as Schroeder holds all pleasure to be. (The fairly standard multiple relatively-segregated loops model of striatal processing, and views of conscious processing, are reviewed in The Cognitive Neurosciences, 3rd ed., 2004, chs. 33 & 82, respectively.) This may be the relevant lesson of recent research on conscious visual experience, more than Schroeder's inference that all conscious experience should be localized in dedicated cortical regions (so that we must find unclaimed cortical real estate to be pleasure's 'home'). The extreme corticalization of primate visual experience may mislead, when assumed to apply to other domains. The affective counterparts of conscious recurrent activation of higher with primary visual cortices may well take place in circuits involving different levels of the nervous system, cortical and subcortical, as Kent Berridge suggests.

The large and fast-growing scientific literatures Schroeder has so diligently studied, accessibly explained, and eloquently called to philosophers' attention will hold increasing importance for philosophy of mind and moral psychology, even if, as suggested above, his ambitious claims are unwarranted now. His philosophical imagination and argumentative ingenuity are of a high order; still, arguments depending on having exhausted the philosophical and scientific possibilities are premature. They give little reason to feel pushed now toward the grand synthesis with desire-satisfaction views in ethics, well criticized by Scanlon and Adams, apparently projected. Even so, we owe Schroeder thanks for so courageously lighting our way.