Time, Memory, Institution: Merleau-Ponty's New Ontology of Self

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David Morris and Kym Maclaren (eds.), Time, Memory, Institution: Merleau-Ponty's New Ontology of Self, Ohio University Press, 2015, 279pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780821421086.

Reviewed by Frank Chouraqui, Leiden University


Merleau-Ponty scholarship is a notably active subfield of continental (and increasingly, not-so-continental) philosophy, and the International Merleau-Ponty Circle is the most important institutional framework for this vibrancy. This volume is largely composed of essays presented at the 2008 meeting of the Circle. In spite of broad discrepancies in philosophical standards, the speculative dimension of these contributions powerfully illustrates how Merleau-Ponty commentary is not only a subject for the history of philosophy but also truly a philosophical endeavour in its own right.

The volume’s character is largely determined by contextual factors, the Conference of 2008, the environment of the Merleau-Ponty Circle in general and the renewed interest in Merleau-Ponty’s work. With this context come many of the book’s strengths, chief among them its surprising thematic unity across a broad range of authors and a consistent concern for textual analysis. This context also explains some of its weaknesses, including a tendency to private language, assumedly borrowed from Merleau-Ponty but which different contributors clearly understand in different ways. To this extent, the “conference” feel of some of the papers — that of specialists addressing other specialists — may alienate some readers. Another great value of the book is that like the Merleau-Ponty Circle in general, it brings together younger scholars and heavy-hitters such as Edward S. Casey, Véronique M. Fóti, and John Russon, Galen A. Johnson (a long-time Merleau-Ponty Circle general-secretary), and Bernhard Waldenfels.

The volume’s thematic focus is Merleau-Ponty’s ontology of time. The other key concepts announced in the title, “Memory,” “Institution,” and the “Ontology of self,” should be read as indicating the various aspects of Merleau-Ponty’s account of time, and not a series of parallel themes. As several of the contributions point out, these concepts are more or less directly brought together in Merleau-Ponty’s famous declaration that we must regard “the subject as time and time as the subject.” Such a robust interdependence between subjectivity and time necessarily problematizes the subject-object distinction and thus gestures towards ontology. As the editors’ introduction suggests: “the self and time can thus shed light on each other — and on an ontology that they share.” (1) The question therefore becomes that of the essence of the subjective life of time in memory and of its mode of existence, which Merleau-Ponty calls institution.

In their various permutations, the three key concepts of the title do not seem to do much towards an elucidation of “Merleau-Ponty’s New Ontology of Self” announced in the subtitle. This is partly for good and partly for not-so-good reasons. Good reasons: any serious engagement with the interdependence of time and self involves a problematization of the concept of self so radical that any ontology of self must be regarded as an abstraction. This, of course, is not enough to reject any talk of self, but rather, in Merleau-Pontian fashion, it demands that one makes an ontology of the illusion called self: if a first-level ontology of self is impossible, one might want to move to a second-level ontology of self. This amounts to asking the question of individuation: how does a continuous being present itself as diverse, made up of distinct selves and others, subjects and time(s)? This is the deeper question that informs Merleau-Ponty’s entire ontology at least in his three last formidable years. The editors have divided the volume into three parts, each of four or five contributions; let me take them in turn.

Part I, “Memory and the Temporality of Self,” helpfully prepares the reader for the later engagements with Merleau-Ponty’s thoughts on time and subjectivity. All four contributions converge towards the idea that subjects and time cannot be objectified (presumably, they are not beings but modes of being, although none of the contributions makes this point explicitly). As non-objective, they are indeterminate, that is to say, extensible (Kirsten Jacobson), Protean (Elizabeth A. Behnke), discontinuous (Glen A. Mazis) and layered (Russon). Jacobson opens with a phenomenological description of the experience of engaging with one’s home in contradistinction from one’s house. This experience reveals our ability to transcend the subjective and the objective: the homely dimension of our house is an extension of my sense of self, which is therefore “dilated” (30) beyond the “objective limits of our body.” (32) This, she argues, should be our paradigm for an understanding of memory as an extension of the self in which the past retains its first-personal character.

Mazis turns from the question of the subject to that of temporalities: temporalities, too, are disparate and extensible, he argues. And with his usual radicalism, he adds that they might not only extend themselves into grey areas; there also exist fissures and oblivion, that is to say, discontinuities (49). Yet, Mazis recognizes that Merleau-Ponty’s view requires that “Moments are in some sense discrete from one another, and yet at the same time are ‘piled’ into one moment”. (47) This paradox is, Mazis, suggests, magically solved by the body that he regards as performing the “going together of what . . . may seem even to be mutually exclusive.” (45).

Behnke returns to the question of the subject and its ability to exceed objective boundaries. She introduces the notion of a null-body determined in proprioceptive terms: the null-body is the body that one doesn’t feel, the center of the power Merleau-Ponty evokes when he says that our bodies are experienced as an “I can.” Behnke implicitly reprises Jan Patočka’s famous analogy of the hiker (in “Phenomenology and Ontology of Motion”) whose body allows her to walk, but once tiredness sets in, becomes the obstacle to her walking. It is this experience of the body as a limit that turns the null-body into an object. This is a useful conceptual addition that opens up, as Behnke demonstrates, a rigorous starting point for relating Merleau-Ponty’s philosophy with the implicit philosophies contained in somatic practices (Behnke here insists on Feldenkrais techniques, Gendlin’s process model, and the Trager technique).

Following on the themes of multifarious time and of dilated selves, Russon offers a discussion of habit inspired by Aristotle, thereby invigorating the usual discussions of habit in Merleau-Ponty that relate him to Ravaisson or Bergson. Russon takes habit to be a prototype of sedimentation and a “kind of ‘lived induction’,” offering a model for the synthesis of the three instances of time (93). He concludes, in parallel with Mazis, that the inherence of habit to the fabric of selfhood involves the impossibility of personal self-identity, and he therefore calls for a view of expression as the “discontinuous temporality of the advent” (100) revealing “the permanent possibility for the advent of a new beginning.” (102)

Part II, “Expression, Institution, and Ontology,” focuses on questions of ontogenesis: how can new facts, events, or objects be drawn from being, and what can these new products be? The five papers in this section seem to imply that in the case of Merleau-Ponty, these two questions can be addressed single-handedly, with reference to the notion of advent, that is to say, the idea that history creates new beings out of a dialectical game between possibilities (created through advents) and actualities (creating through events).

Robert Vallier opens the section with a welcome textual analysis of the (then) newly translated lecture courses of 1954-55 on Institution and on Passivity. He correctly emphasises their interconnectedness, which he regards as a sign that the process of institution is passive. This should be read in the context of Vallier’s correct insistence that “Passivity is … not the antonym of activity, but instead an experience that refers us to an ontological anteriority”. (112) In short, passivity, like institution, (and Vallier adds, like memory too) is not to be indexed on a subject that would initiate and exhaust it: they are experiences of a flux that proceeds and exceeds the subject. In this flux, activity and passivity lose their antonymic value.

Donald A. Landes argues that Merleau-Ponty’s model for the interaction of ideal structures and real bodies is borrowed form Bergson. His argument is largely textual: he relates Merleau-Ponty’s rare allusions to weight to Bergson’s use of weight when accounting for mutual influence and action at a distance. Although Landes’ paper is beautifully written and thought-out, it seems hard to accept the idea that Merleau-Ponty would follow Bergson in a question so crucial for his entire thought and which he thought Bergson handled so poorly.1 Indeed, it seems that the reference to the theme of weight, if a subtle thematization on Landes’ part, may have more to do with the famous exchange between Elisabeth and Descartes (tackled by Merleau-Ponty in the Phenomenology of Perception and in which Elisabeth rejects Descartes analogy of weight to explain mental causation) than with Bergson. If Descartes and Bergson’s purism requires magical mediation of the kind displayed in such a conception of weight, it seems we must rather hold that Merleau-Ponty’s view stands against such purism.

Of the five papers of Part II, Fóti’s contribution comes closest to offering an explicit reflection on modes of being in relation to Merleau-Ponty’s notion of advent. She argues that the centrality of the theme of expression in Merleau-Ponty informs his entire ontology: an ontology of relative creativity (something one might call actualization) and relative repetition (since actualization only enacts a possibility that precedes it). She writes illuminatingly: "expressive adequation not only avoids both sheer fabrication and coincidence; it also resolves the “paradox of expression” in that the originary silence is neither understood as absolute . . . nor relinquished". In opposition to Mazis and Russon (and implicitly, Landes), she stands for continuity.

The question of the movement from silence to expression, which Fóti accounted for by denying that there even was absolute silence, is continued by Scott Marratto who, unlike Fóti, sees Merleau-Ponty as emphasising “the spontaneity and generativity of the act of expression” (163) leading into a model in which absolute silence requires an absolute event to attain expression. Yet, although Marratto commits himself to a discontinuistic reading of early and middle Merleau-Ponty, he recognizes that this changes in Merleau-Ponty’s later work which is “no longer characterized by an original silence of consciousness” and in which, in Marratto’s potent phrase, the subject is now characterized as “the impossibility of remaining silent.” (163) Marratto’s reading contains powerful ethical undertones which might want complementing with Vallier’s remarks on the impossibility to begin noise or silence in the subject: this impossibility might indicate that silence silences not the subject but being itself.

Closing the section, Caterina Rea sets out to establish that philosophy owes a debt to the Freudian concept of deferred retroaction, which provided it with the primacy of mediation. (180) Historically, this is a contentious point (think of the preface of the Phenomenology of Perception, which establishes exactly the primacy of mediation with the sole resources of phenomenology and no references to psychoanalysis). Philosophically, and leaving psychoanalysis aside, the primacy of mediation is a fundamental point for Merleau-Ponty scholarship, and especially for the problem of continuity and difference which recurs throughout the book. For the primacy of mediation carries with it the impossibility of absolute breaks (or silences) and the impossibility of complete identity. Psychoanalysis or not, the importance of Rea’s point cannot be overstated.

The title of Part III, “The Ontology of Time,” should be read in both senses of “of”: the four papers in this section both reconstruct Merleau-Ponty’s ontological description of time and suggest that time is the object of Merleau-Ponty’s ontology, i.e., in Heideggerian fashion, that being is time.

Michael R. Kelly’s paper offers a smooth transition from the discussion of Part II as he traces the movement of Merleau-Ponty’s transition from phenomenology to ontology as organized around an engagement with Heidegger’s Kantbuch. This argument coincides with the idea that while the Cogito chapter of the Phenomenology of Perception exposed the remains of Merleau-Ponty’s early intellectualism, the Temporality chapter was already showing the way towards the later ontology.

Waldenfels’ remarkable contribution, originally published in German, anticipated Kelly’s argument about the connections between the Phenomenology of Perception and the Kantbuch. However, Waldenfels’ position (correctly, I think) opposes Kelly’s (whose paper is entitled “The Subject as Time”) when he declares that “in his Phenomenology of Perception, the author understands time straightforwardly as a subject.” (216) He cites Merleau-Ponty’s famous phrase: “We must understand time as subject and the subject as time” and comments: “But what this double ‘as’ indicates is only a partial, not a complete coincidence; it does not exclude another understanding of time.” (220) It is only at the cost of changing our views on time that we can understand how time is subject: the new understanding is that of a double movement which is more than a simple reduction of the subject to time: it is the futurally-projected actualization of a past possibility.

Johnson’s beautiful paper, originally published in French, tackles a similar question as Waldenfels’ and returns to the problem of continuity: “a true philosophy of time must establish both passage or becoming and discontinuity or incompleteness.” (243) Johnson argues, against Lyotard, that Merleau-Ponty’s later thought is no longer a thought of time as continuity. There are, paradigmatically, two radical events: birth and death. Ignoring the fact that strictly speaking, birth and death may be phenomenologically regarded as limit poles but not experiences, Johnson is more concerned with another “radical irruption” (243), that of “the symbol” (246): the work of art should be seen as both a radical event and advent (250), a unity of discontinuity and continuity.

Casey’s paper is written with his well-known elegance and clarity and consists in a phenomenological analysis of the notion of edge. His profound question is that of individuation, which, as Kant’s third critique shows, is a question about delineation. Casey begins by declaring that “Merleau-Ponty thought was guided by three closely related philosophical passions: continuism, plenarism, and wholism.” He proceeds by noting that the experience of edges is always an experience not of a clear-cut border but of a boundary, not of the end of a space, but of a space itself, borrowed from both sides, one that is as much a place of difference as a place of continuity, a transition. According to Casey, the fundamental experience of edge precedes both time and space and organizes it: at the most fundamental, being is individuation itself, and although Casey doesn’t make the reference explicit, he gestures towards “the unmotivated upsurge of being” Merleau-Ponty discussed in the famous preface to the Phenomenology of Perception to show how being is first of all a making visible of the undifferentiated by way of differentiation.

It should be visible by now how these essays — despite deep and sometimes striking disagreements — offer an interestingly consistent take on some of Merleau-Ponty’s most basic views on time and make one major, if unexpected contribution: they force into the debate the question of Merleau-Ponty’s relation to continuity and difference. Based on this volume, we can make a few preliminary remarks towards a more explicit debate.

First of all, the current state of the scholarship is divided between two positions: the discontinuists argue for the existence of gaps, silences, holes etc. in being. The other camp is not, as one might expect (or as Russon seems to imply), the camp of the identitarians, but of those who seek an overcoming of the mutual exclusion of difference and continuity. This can take two forms: the first is juxtapositonal, and the other is modal: modal differences do not require either radical difference or self-identity.

Secondly, the discontinuist view will have to avoid — or justify — the appeal to magical procedures to explain the interaction of radically different entities and develop treasures of invention to explain away the many texts of Merleau-Ponty’s that reject radical difference precisely because it involves radical self-identity (see the chapter on the dialectic in The Visible and the Invisible) and that “the total determinacy of even one object is the death of consciousness.” (Preface to the Phenomenology of Perception) This makes the discontinuist view and the juxtapositional view indistinguishable. This leaves the modal position with the task of explaining how continuity makes any experience of (even illusory) difference possible, and how it avoids coming to an ontology of the undifferentiated (bearing in mind Merleau-Ponty’s claim that the undifferentiated is imperceptible).

Third, it seems the solution will have to reside in a unified notion of being whose essence is its activity of self-differentiation — an argument I have made elsewhere — leading us back to Rea’s primacy of mediation: can we think of being as a unique presentation whose essence it is to present itself as a diversity?

 1  In his course of 1947-48, he declared: “Bergson misses the articulation of the two levels he had described: he tries in vain to operate their synthesis by way of the pure juxtaposition of two objective elements: pure percept and pure memory.” (88) In short, all of Bergson’s strategies for unifying the ideal and the real (presumably including the weight analogy) are insufficient.