To Follow: The Wake of Jacques Derrida

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Peggy Kamuf, To Follow: The Wake of Jacques Derrida, Edinburgh University Press, 2010, 201pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748641543.

Reviewed by Elissa Marder, Emory University


Peggy Kamuf long ago established herself as one of Jacques Derrida's most discerning readers and finest translators, but in To Follow: The Wake of Jacques Derrida, she offers her readers a rare opportunity to follow her as she works through critical questions in Derrida's thinking in the wake of his death. The book comprises seventeen beautifully written and delicately interwoven chapters, composed before and after Derrida's death in October 2004. In each chapter, Kamuf picks up on a word or phrase (what she calls a "watchword") in Derrida's writings in order to attend to the critical inventions and political interventions called forth by and in his thought.

This illuminating and moving book is also explicitly a work of mourning. Following Derrida's life-long work on mourning, Kamuf begins her book by pointing out that mourning does not begin with the other's death but is at work from the beginning in the names by which we come to know ourselves and through which we are called by others: "From the very first, every name, anyone's name, names a site of mourning to come." And if, as Kamuf suggests, the name is itself another name for mourning, this is because every name bears the trace of a division within: to be what we call a name, a name must be repeatable in the absence of the one to whom it ostensibly "belongs" and therefore must always be able to live on after the death of its bearer. In this sense, then, a proper name is not the property of the person named as it is also borne and carried by those who follow. It will follow from this that mourning is always already at work in every relation with the other. Mourning conditions all ethical positions and political actions and cannot be relegated to a uniquely personal experience in spite of (or perhaps even because of) the singular unbearability that attends each person's "personal" experience of loss.

Thus, although To Follow is punctuated by several poignant "personal" anecdotes (culled from her long professional and personal relationship with Derrida as critic, translator, and friend), its primary critical focus (and philosophical appeal) resides in the way that Kamuf cares for Derrida's legacy by caring about the ways in which his own inimitable texts are themselves responsive readings to the question of what it means to inhabit or inherit a tradition. Inheritance, Kamuf reminds us, is not a positive value that is passively received, but rather requires attentive and attuned reading. Throughout the book, Kamuf explores how Derrida's legacy takes the form of haunting questions that ask us to keep watch for what cannot be seen, known, or understood in advance: "The watch watches for -- it knows not what may come. This vigilance does not anticipate or expect an arrival that will put an end to or interrupt its waiting, but nonetheless it watches for another's coming to interrupt it" (11).

Kamuf's titular phrase "to follow" can thus be heard as her way of countersigning one of the most urgent and paradoxical imperatives of Derrida's legacy -- that one must keep watch and remain vigilantly open to what is both unforeseen and unforeseeable. Without this sort of vigilance, nothing can move, nothing can happen, there is no other, and there is no future. Indeed, the question of what it means to be open (to the other, to the event, to the future) is arguably the central motif of the entire book. To remain open to the other, Kamuf suggests, requires that one abandon known certainties in order to open oneself up to the surprise of unknown encounters: "There is an alertness tensed in advance toward that which will all the same surprise, overcome, and interrupt it" (11). Another name for this special kind of receptive vigilance -- without which there would be no surprises -- is "reading." Only when one approaches a text as an unknown other can one be surprised by it. To encounter the other, therefore, is to be on the watch for surprising encounters that can only take place when one encounters the other as text:

To say that the other is encountered as text not only makes all ethics an ethics of reading, but also thereby recalls that the other person is not, first of all or above all, a potential site of knowledge that I can appropriate, at least not without leveling all that makes that other other. (74)

In keeping with this ethical imperative to remain open to the other as text, in her own writing on Derrida in To Follow, Kamuf eschews any identification with her own professional and institutional position as an established "authority" on Derrida and openly chooses instead to cast herself in the role of student, friend, and especially, reader. Because she allows herself (as reader) to be continually surprised by his writings, her book bears witness to some of the important surprises found in (and produced by) Derrida's writing. Kamuf both thematizes and theorizes the importance of reading Derrida as a text rather than reading him as a philosopher "as such." In several of the book's chapters, she invokes Derrida's complicated relationship to the name "philosophy" and to what is included and excluded under that name by pointing out that Derrida's thinking radically troubles the profession of philosophy even as it remains thoroughly indebted to it:

He thus raises the stakes considerably for the profession of philosophy, which, even as he displaces what we can profess to hear and understand by "profession," he never renounces, vigorously defends, and tirelessly renews through his teaching. At stake from now on, for all those who have learned it from and with Derrida, is not only the possibility of distinguishing philosophy from all it professes to exclude (literature, poetry, autobiography, individual experience, the singular idiom, and so on), but also the possibility of "personal," that is singular experience uncontaminated by repetition and generalization, by substitution and metonymy. For this is perhaps the greatest scandal of Derrida's thought insofar as it flaunts the exclusion of singular experience or affect from the realm of general truth: his work shows us how to read that distinction as a barrier that has protected not just ideas of truth's generality but also -- that of the propriety or property of one's own experience, of experience as, in the ordinary expression, irreducibly personal and thus inaccessible to another. With his thinking of differance and general contamination, substitution, and metonymy, Derrida makes or rather lets the distinction between self/not-self, ownness/other-ness, as well as generality/singularity tremble and blur, a trembling and a blurring that, as he would argue, is the irremediable condition of what one wants to call, so as to experience it, one's "own" experience. (75-76)

Kamuf's vigilant resistance (to discourses of all sorts) that would confine Derrida's work to a "professional" philosophical designation (according to which his work could be inscribed, as an institutional figure -- a professor of philosophy -- within a known or knowable philosophical tradition) is one of the central imperatives that runs through her book. She remains on the watch for what has been done to Derrida (and to the questions with which he is concerned) by those who would pretend to know how to speak for him or in the name of philosophy. In the final chapter of the book, "The Philosopher, As Such, and the Death Penalty," Kamuf shows how Derrida (who almost never speaks in the name of "Philosophy" as such) uncharacteristically chooses to identify himself "as a philosopher" precisely in order to take a stand against the traditional philosophical position regarding the death penalty. As Kamuf points out, Derrida speaks "as a philosopher" only in order to speak out against what has been done in the name of philosophy by the greatest names in the philosophical tradition. Here she quotes Derrida as he names those philosophers' names: "From Plato to Hegel, from Rousseau to Kant (who was undoubtedly the most rigorous of them all), they expressly, each in his own way, and sometimes not without much hand-wringing (Rousseau) took a stand for the death penalty." (Jacques Derrida and Elisabeth Roudinseco, For What Tomorrow: A Dialogue, tr. Jeff Fort, Stanford University Press, 2004, 146. Quoted in To Follow, 188.) Glossing this ironic stance toward the profession of philosophy "as such," she writes:

From the fact that the persons named all took sides for the death penalty, even as they were also philosophers as such, what should one deduce? What happened during the leap that takes its footing on the philosophically solid ground of the "as such" in order to jump with two feet in the direction of the properly political ground of the side taken (for or against)? What has to happen so that the one named Assuch (as if it were now a proper name) leaps in the direction of the for or against, the political terrain where one declares oneself in one's proper name? Can Assuch leap and keep his name as such? Does philosophy, as philosophy that is property of the Assuch family, know how to leap, can it leap without putting its name at risk, without throwing it in its own face? (189)

Throughout To Follow, Kamuf invites her readers to share her sense that to be "familiar" with Derrida's thinking means that one must be able to resist reading his legacy "Assuch," so as to remain open to its ongoing surprises. Each chapter bears the trace of some reading event through which Kamuf discovers a new approach to some of Derrida's most important and urgent concerns including: passive decision ("Bartleby"), mass-media and politics ("Tape-Recorded Surprise," "Affect of America," and "Stunned"), the death penalty ("La Morsure" and "The Philosopher, As Such"), sovereignty, auto-immunity, and possibility ("From Now On"), blindness and/in the experience of the other ("To Do Justice to 'Rousseau,'" "The Ear, Who?"). Among the resonant "watchwords" that Kamuf traces throughout the book, one of the most resonant emerges through her treatment of Derrida's interrogation of the philosophical concept of "possibility." In her own marvelous readings of the exchanges between Derrida and Hélène Cixous, she demonstrates how Derrida turns to Cixous for a writing of "life" that would be bound to something other than "possibility" founded upon sovereign power. In "From Now On" (which is arguably the theoretical heart of the book) Kamuf explains how sovereignty, ipseity, and possibility are inextricably bound up with one another and sovereign power and proposes a compelling case for the idea that Derrida provides us with a way of disassociating imperative sovereignty (which is inevitably bound up with force) from the spectral performance of an unconditionality that might (albeit impossibly) resist the totalizing and recuperative powers of sovereign force.

Who can tell what the legacy of Jacques Derrida will have been? This question, posed from the vantage point of an unknowable and unforeseeable future is, of course, impossible to answer here and now. But Kamuf's elegant and lucid book takes us a long way toward beginning to think about how to read that legacy from now on. At several punctual moments in To Follow, Kamuf recalls her own first encounter with Derrida-as-text through the books that were first given to her by others when she was a student, accompanied by the imperative phrase, "you've got to read this." Through her own exemplary readings of Derrida's texts, Kamuf shows why this writing matters so much, why reading Derrida is necessary, why, in other words "il faut le faire." If Derrida's legacy is to survive into the future, you've got to read this book.