Torture and Dignity: An Essay on Moral Injury

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J. M. Bernstein, Torture and Dignity: An Essay on Moral Injury, University of Chicago Press, 2015, 407pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226266329.

Reviewed by Craig Duncan, Ithaca College


J. M. Bernstein’s book is ambitious in its aims. These aims include: to rethink the moral wrong of torture, by portraying it as a form of moral “devastation”; to show that the wrong of rape belongs to the same moral kind as the wrong of torture (in a slogan, “rape is torture”); and to force us to rethink some central notions of moral thought — in particular, the notion of dignity, which Bernstein wants to shift away from its common Kantian associations with rationally autonomous wills, so that we may uncover as-yet unrecognized associations between dignity and the physical human form (“embodiment”), social trust, and love. For reasons that I will explain in what follows, I found the book to be both illuminating and frustrating.

Chapter One is historical in focus, and argues that the eighteenth century witnessed an important shift in legal, political, and moral thinking. According to Bernstein, a “humanitarian revolution” (26) took place over the course of this century (Bernstein assigns the legal philosopher Cesare Beccaria a starring role in his account of this revolution). At the century’s start a “law of sovereign torture” held sway, in which the authority of law was vested in (rather than distinct from) the authority of the sovereign person. The sovereign’s authority was put on display in public exhibitions of torture (of criminals and enemies), which were intended as awe-inspiring occasions that would communally affirm the sovereign’s rightful power. It was “rule of awe” rather than rule of law, we might say (though this formula is mine, not Bernstein’s). By century’s end, however, a new ethos was detectable, in which the sovereign draws its authority from law, rather than the reverse, and in which due process safeguards reflect a new view of the human individual, namely, a view “of the individual’s having an intrinsic worth that legal and political arrangements must be answerable to” (40).

Chapter Two explores the experience of torture in more depth, in order to develop a phenomenological vocabulary adequate to understanding the harm of torture. Central to Bernstein’s argument here is a reading of Jean Améry’s 1966 work At the Mind’s Limits, in which Améry describes and reflects on his torture at the hands of the Gestapo (after having been captured as a Nazi-resister) and his subsequent internment in concentration camps until the conclusion of the war. By Améry’s own account, his horrific experiences left him a broken man, and Bernstein stiches together the various threads of Améry’s reflections into an account of torture’s harm, a harm that Bernstein calls “devastation”: “‘Devastation,’ as I shall use this term, refers to the experience of being undone in one’s standing as a human, and to continue to experience the event of destruction as a present moral fact about oneself” (75-76). If one has not suffered this injury, then one’s standing as a human is intact, and one’s pain is itself understood as a signal to others of something gone wrong, of one’s need for assistance. In torture, however, the social meaning of pain is cancelled, and thus torture is “the cancellation of one’s mattering” (103). Instead, one is wholly at the mercy of another, the torturer, who stands over one as an absolute sovereign. A consequence of devastation, argues Bernstein, is a loss of trust in the world (a loss of trust that others do not intend us harm) — a loss that persists even after the episode of torture ends, so that one who is tortured remains tortured (110).

Chapter Three, picking up on a remark of Améry’s in which he compares torture and rape (117), aims to construct an account of the harms of torture and rape that reveals them to be species of the same moral genus of wrong. Exploring the features that torture and rape have in common leads Bernstein to several conclusions: that both harms reduce the self to an identity with the involuntary body; that both harms demonstrate the fact that vulnerability to harm — or, in Bernstein’s terminology (which I wish had been given a more precise definition) existential helplessness — is an inescapable aspect of selfhood, despite the fact that it is typically unnoticed by those who operate with basic trust in the world (a trust that is destroyed by torture and rape); and that loss of trust in others threatens the undoing of the self, which according to Bernstein exists through its relations with other selves. In this sense, torture and rape must be understood, not just as physical injuries, but paradigmatically as moral injuries — as injuries to “the person of the victim” (122; emphasis in original). That is to say, they are each a form of “devastation” in the moralized sense previously defined.

Chapter Four aims to vindicate the relational account of the self that the previous chapter employed in its diagnosis of the harms of rape and torture. By Bernstein’s own lights, this is the “most philosophically technical” chapter in the book (16); by my lights, it is the least successful chapter. In it, Bernstein defends a Hegelian account of the self, according to which the self is a normative construction constituted through its relations to others, so that recognition of the right kind by others is necessary for one even to exist as a self. These are metaphysically ambitious claims — too ambitious I believe. Matters are not helped by Bernstein’s apparent wish to stay quite close to Hegel’s own views, including in particular Hegel’s puzzling claim that “self-consciousness is desire itself” and his puzzling claim that a person who has not risked his life "has not achieved the truth of being recognized as a self-sufficient self-consciousness.1 Bernstein’s interpretation of Hegel draws on some recent work on Hegel by Robert Brandom but far from clarifying matters, I found that Bernstein’s engagement with this secondary source only compounded the difficulty of the exposition.2

Readers who are antecedently attracted to Hegelian ideas regarding the nature of the self are likely to warm to this chapter by Bernstein, but readers who lack such an attraction are likely to find the argument tough-going. Here is my best attempt at a rough paraphrase of Chapter Four’s argument that existence as a self-conscious being requires the recognition of others. Human beings are directed by their desires to represent the world (the better the representation, the better the satisfaction of desires). That is to say, human representations are rooted in desiring perspectives (which Bernstein, following Brandom, somewhat confusingly calls “erotic strivings” — confusingly, because such strivings needn’t be sexual in nature). Thus, I as a human being can see and conceptualize objects in the world, but I do so from my own desiring perspective. However, to “see” myself — to conceptualize myself — I must see myself from an outside perspective, that is, from the perspective of an external being other than myself; this is because the seeing instrument cannot directly see itself. A danger, though, lurks: the external being (whose perspective I use to see myself) could view me as just another object in the world. That will not do; to understand myself as self-conscious, the external perspective that represents me must represent me as conscious, as not a mere object in the world, like a rock or chair. Thus I can only be self-conscious — I can only represent myself as conscious — if an external being recognizes me as a fellow conscious being.

If this is a fair paraphrase of the main thrust of Bernstein’s argument (and given the thorny prose of the chapter, I write that as a rather diffident “if”), then the argument seems vulnerable. Must the recognition by others be ongoing in order for me to sustain my sense of self, or will a one-time recognitive “baptism,” so to speak, suffice for this? Bernstein favors the former possibility — indeed, the peril that torture and rape pose is that they threaten the continuity of my selfhood by their withdrawing of recognition. However, even though it is clear which of these contrasting possibilities Bernstein prefers, I wish he had done more to explore the contrast between initial consciousness of self and sustained self-consciousness. Another objection: Why must the external perspective from which I represent myself be the perspective of another being? Why not a “view from nowhere” (to borrow Thomas Nagel’s phrase), that is, a centerless perspective? In response, one might say that all representation is rooted in “erotic striving,” and thus is always centered in some other being’s perspective, but that strikes me as an implausibly strong claim to make. Moreover, even if one could vindicate such a claim, must a being find recognition in actual others in order for that being to exist as a self-aware being, or could a thought experiment, say, in which one imagines oneself from the perspective of a hypothetical other, suffice to enable this self-awareness? If it won’t suffice, is this a psychological fact (to wit, that a being who lacks the recognition of actual others will be psychologically unable to understand itself as a self-conscious)? Or is it a conceptual fact (to wit, that a being necessarily could not understand itself as a self-conscious in the absence of actual recognition by others, like a triangle necessarily could not have four sides)? Bernstein’s frequent talk of “the self” being “constituted” by its social relations suggests that he intends the stronger, conceptual claim. But in that case, I think more engagement with the metaphysical literature on constitution, and even the literature on personal identity, would be necessary for a fully adequate defense of the position.

However, I believe these metaphysical shortcomings are somewhat detachable from the overall arc of argument in the book. Even if one is skeptical of Bernstein’s conclusion that in the absence of ongoing recognition by others the self could not possibly exist, it remains true that one’s self-understanding expresses itself at least in part in how one presents oneself to others, and sane individuals are not indifferent to social norms of self-presentation that have wide currency in their society. Thus, Bernstein is correct that social norms are heavily implicated in persons’ self-understandings. In the second half of Chapter Four Bernstein turns to the question of self-presentation, and in doing so draws on the work of the early twentieth century German philosopher Helmuth Plessner. In this part of the chapter, Bernstein is often illuminating, despite the fact that the prose remains quite intimidating. A sample passage:

What Plessner refers to as our brokenness corresponds to what Hegel calls the negativity of self-consciousness. The negation at the core of self-consciousness is the negation of centric positionality, of the instinctual automatic resolution of the coordination between being and having a body. Ex-centric positionality is Plessner’s term for self-consciousness; it is just the thought that the relation between the body I am and the body I have must be achieved — at every moment — and that achievement occurs through my consciousness of myself both as a center of an environment, with respect to my needs and desires, and decentered with respect to that environment, a way in which my body is also simply another object in a neutral environment.

I believe this passage is decodable, even if not easily so. A key distinction employed in it is the distinction between “the body I have” and “the body I am.” The former (the body I have) is what Bernstein frequently refers to as the “involuntary body”; it is “the spatially extended body that breathes, blushes, sneezes, hiccups, snores, lactates, flinches” and so on (200; the list continues for a quite a few more items). By contrast, the latter (the body I am) is the “voluntary body,” which for humans is “the body whose actions are mediated through concepts and social rules” (201). (Think of the numerous social rules governing one’s management of one’s various bodily functions, e.g. what you can and cannot do in public, and so on.) A central task in human life, says Bernstein, is the coordination of being a body and having a body, and this coordinative task is central to one’s self-understanding. I believe he is right about this; ask yourself, for instance, whether your sense of self could survive unchanged were you to lose the control you now have of, say, your body’s excretory functions. It is this insight that informs Bernstein’s account of the harm of torture and rape (more so, I believe, than his more exotic metaphysical claims pertaining to the constitution of self-consciousness). For it allows him to diagnose the harm of these crimes as the severing of the relation one has forged between one’s being a body and one’s having a body, so that one is left merely with being a body, and thereby with a sense of self that at the very least is severely diminished, even if not obliterated.

Having argued that social norms and social recognition are important to a being’s self-presentation, which in turn is important to be a being’s self-understanding, in Chapter Five Bernstein turns to consider trust, and there argues that trust is in essence the life blood animating this interplay of sociality and self-making. He states his thesis provocatively as follows: “Trust is the routine, ideally omnipresent yet mostly invisible ethical substance of everyday life” (222). Citing Annette Baier’s definition of trust as “accepted vulnerability to another’s possible but not expected ill will (or lack of good will) toward one,” Bernstein argues that the human self’s inescapable dependence on the recognition of others entails a permanent vulnerability, and hence, a ubiquitous need for trust.3 But he goes further, and takes his argument in an interesting direction. Trust relations, according to Bernstein, can be rationally evaluated but are not themselves the creation of reason: “Trust, one might say, is subject to rational correction and modification, but not to rational installation; reason is the caretaker of trust, not its creator (or ground)” (230). A brief summary can’t do justice to his argument for this claim, but the basic idea is that to be effective, trust must operate more or less invisibly behind the scenes. To call for trust’s justification is to adopt an interrogating cast of mind and thereby put oneself in tension with the stance of trust, rendering oneself unable to summon it into existence out of nothing. Instead of being rationally created, trust is “the spontaneous, prereflective attitude guiding responses to the appearance of routine interaction partners” (234).

However, if trust is not capable of being rationally installed, how, then, is trust created? This query leads Bernstein to draw upon developmental psychology and argue that attitudes of trust are the normal product of healthy “first love” — that is, parental love — which produces a being who is convinced of his/her intrinsic worth and who expects to be treated by others as a being of intrinsic worth. I found these psychological claims to be believable, but by relegating discussion of the relevant psychological literature largely to the footnotes, Bernstein’s account — plausible though it is — has something of the air of a “just so” story. I would have preferred more explicit engagement with the empirical literature here. For example, what rival psychological accounts have been defended in this vein, and what phenomena does Bernstein’s preferred theory do a better job explaining than those rivals? Answering those questions would offer further support to Bernstein’s account of trust.

The final full chapter of the book aims to tie together the various previous strands of argument into an account of dignity. Bernstein’s stated goal in this chapter is to offer an account of the interrelations between the several elements in what he calls “the dignity constellation” (265): respect, self-respect, love, and lovability. Dignity, according to Bernstein, is the representation of an individual’s intrinsic worth. His introduction to this chapter offers a helpful summary of the relations that he sees within the dignity constellation:

The consequence of adequate first love is the expectation of appropriate treatment by relevant social others; the ethical term for such an expectation is self-respect; self-respect is thus the practical, first-person realization of an adequate appreciation of one’s lovability. To believe one is lovable is to have or come to have self-respect; self-respect is belief in one’s intrinsic self-worth. Self-respect is the representation of an individual’s intrinsic self-worth as it becomes manifest through resistance to what might threaten it . . . What others respect, however, is not your self-respect, but your intrinsic self-worth, your dignity (20).

This is an appealing picture, and Bernstein in this chapter returns to the work of Améry, skillfully mobilizing Améry’s account of his suffering in support of this picture of the dignity constellation. He also uses Améry’s account to extend the picture, arguing that Améry’s devastating experiences attuned him to the bodily dimension of dignity — in particular, attuned Améry to the fact that one key element of dignity lies in achieving an appropriate relation between the body I am and the body I have. This line of inquiry terminates in a moving contrast that Bernstein constructs between ordinary, dignity-conferring burial rites of human corpses and the horrifying treatment of the corpses of Jews within concentration camps. Only an embodied conception of dignity can explain this latter horror, argues Bernstein. He convinced me.

The book ends with a brief set of “Concluding Remarks,” in which Bernstein aims to describe some serious shortcomings that he sees with contemporary moral approaches. Since he has argued that pre-reflective trust, the emotion of love, and the phenomenon of embodiment are key to understanding this type of moral injury, Bernstein is in a good position to oppose an idealized form of moral rationalism, strains of which can still be found in some contemporary Kantian thinking. However, somewhat curiously, he trains his ire on moral rules (“laws”) themselves. In a summary of his complaint (which he previews in his introduction to the book), Bernstein writes:

The persistence of the law conception of morality in detaching us from an adequate appreciation of the devastating character of rape has not only aided the perpetuation of a rape culture, but alienated us all from our deepest moral impulses and judgments. The morality of law is worse than philosophically wrong; it produces a socially corrosive form of moral alienation (21).

Strong words, indeed, and a bit surprising, given that throughout the book Bernstein has insisted on the importance of moral rights — above all else, a moral right (that is, a human right) to bodily integrity — and moral rights can arguably be understood as a type of moral principle, moral law, or moral rule. His complaint seems to be that a focus on moral rules leads to a misunderstanding of the nature of moral wrongness, insofar as wrongness is taken to consist in the breaking of a rule. No, says Bernstein, wrongness consists in the breaking (injuring) of a person; in behaving wrongly, we wrong a person, and this fact is primary, not the breaking of rules.

Yet this thought is surely not off-limits to rule-based (or principle-based, or law-based) approaches to morality. After all, any approach that recognizes the concept of a moral claim — as most contemporary moral approaches do — will also recognize the wronging of others, since to wrong someone is to violate a valid claim of his or hers. Moreover, few contemporary rule-based moralities make moral rules primary, preferring instead to see moral rules as outputs of moral reasoning rather than starting points. For instance, a contractualist approach to morality will pay great attention to which acts injure others and which promote others’ well-being, and use these facts to settle, via contractualist reasoning, on a set of rules that (to use T. M. Scanlon’s well-known formula) no one could reasonably reject as the basis of informed, unforced, general agreement. Such approaches may not prove viable in the end, but if so, I believe it will not be because they are necessarily blind to the experience of moral injury. Hence I believe Bernstein overstates the revolutionary potential of his moral insights. But no matter; Bernstein’s call for dignity-based moral theory to pay more attention to embodiment, love, and trust are innovative enough, in my judgment.

One final comment, on style rather than substance: in my discussion of the difficult Chapter Four, I had occasion to mention the thorny prose it contains. Such prose, alas, is not confined exclusively to Chapter Four. I found this frustrating, since Bernstein is evidently capable of writing with clarity and eloquence, as numerous passages in the book attest. By way of illustrating both the bad and good, consider the following pair of sentences. On page 104 Bernstein writes

What does the victim’s helplessness mean for the torturer? Améry’s wedge here is perfectly simple: if the apotheosis of existential destitution borne by the victim resides in his helplessness, where helplessness is revealed as an existential or categorial feature of human existence, then the act of torturing is the effort of categorically repudiating that existential conditionality.

I did not find the idea expressed in these sentences to be “perfectly simple.” However, a mere five pages later (109), Bernstein succeeds in expressing essentially the same idea much more simply: “In rendering the other absolutely helpless — the other’s will now belongs to the torturer; the other’s body now belongs to the torturer — the torturer thinks to rid himself of his own helplessness.”

Much better! Unfortunately, the prose throughout the book is something of a tug of war between the author of the first sentence and the author of second sentence, which occasionally makes for a vexing reading experience, with the upshot that I often found Bernstein’s arguments to be more suggestive than dispositive. I also believe the book could have been significantly shorter without losing any of its power; in my judgment, at times the book’s execution was marred by some repetition and discursiveness.

However, even though I cannot say that I was always glad to be reading the book, I am now very glad to have read it. Bernstein’s moral instincts strike me as sound, and his novel ideas pertaining to embodiment, trust, and love — and their relation to dignity — strike me as insightful contributions to moral psychology. I hope that he will continue to explore these themes in future writings, and I hope that other moral philosophers will join him in pursuing the tantalizing leads described in Torture and Dignity.

1 G. W. F. Hegel, Phenomenology of Spirit, trans. Terry Pinkard, sections 167 and 187

2 Brandom, “The Structure of Desire and Recognition: Self-Consciousness and Self-Constitution,” Philosophy and Social Criticism 33:1 (2007), pp. 127-150.

3 Baier, “Trust and Anti-trust,” in her Moral Prejudices: Essays on Ethics (Harvard University Press, 1995), p. 99.