Towards a Philosophy of Real Mathematics

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Corfield, David, Towards a Philosophy of Real Mathematics, Cambridge University Press, 2003, 300pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521817226.

Reviewed by Timothy Bays, University of Notre Dame


To understand David Corfield’s project in Towards a Philosophy of Real Mathematics, it’s useful to begin with three sociological facts. First, the prestigious core of contemporary mathematics involves work in the (partially overlapping) fields of algebra, number theory, analysis, algebraic and differential geometry, algebraic topology, etc.; these are the kinds of fields which every leading mathematics department wants specialists in, and it’s the specialists in these fields who tend to win major mathematics prizes (e.g., Field’s medals). Second, traditional foundational subjects—set theory, proof theory, non-applied model theory, etc.—are rather far out on the prestige periphery; many good departments have no specialists in these fields, and it’s rare for work in these fields to win major mathematics prizes. Third, although most philosophers of mathematics know quite a bit about foundational subjects, few have any deep familiarity with contemporary work in core areas, and still fewer engage core mathematics in the context of their own philosophical work.

Towards a Philosophy of Real Mathematics is an impassioned criticism of this state of affairs. It begins with a largely polemical introduction. On the negative side, Corfield attacks what he calls the “foundationalist filter”—the view that, since all mathematics can be reduced to certain foundational systems, the only really interesting philosophical questions involve the status of those systems (and, perhaps, the status of any meta-mathematics used in the reduction). By applying this filter—often unconsciously—philosophers “fail to detect the pulse of contemporary mathematics” and underestimate the importance of mathematical history (since completed reductions “screen off” the actual historical development of central mathematical concepts). They also ignore an important lesson from general philosophy of science: that interesting philosophical questions arise at many levels of description. After all, few contemporary philosophers would claim that philosophy of biology is pointless simply because “everything ultimately reduces to particle physics.”1

On the positive side, Corfield exhorts philosophers to investigate core mathematics. He notes that much of the philosophical depth and richness of contemporary philosophy of physics comes from that field’s engagement with cutting-edge topics in physics—gauge theory, string theory, quantum gravity, etc.—and he suggests that philosophical investigation of, e.g., category theory or algebraic topology might prove equally fruitful.2 Similarly, he notes that detailed studies of the history of physics have provided important insights into the content of particular physical concepts, into the nature and structure of physical theories, and into the course and structure of scientific progress. He suggests that similar benefits will accrue to the study of historical developments in core mathematics—e.g., the development of the notion of a topological space or a homotopy theory, or the increasing role that category theory has come to play in organizing large swaths of mathematics.

With these preliminary arguments out of the way, Corfield spends the rest of his book giving examples of the kind of work he wants to see more of. Chapters 2–3 provide an extended discussion of automated theorem-proving and conjecture-formulation (highlighting the still-huge gaps between the ways computers and humans do mathematics, and illustrating how little we really understand about the actual reasoning of ordinary human mathematicians). In chapter 4, Corfield explores the role that high-level analogies play in the development of mathematics (focusing centrally on a 19th-century analogy between number fields and function fields which, after 50 or so years of development, “laid the foundations for an extraordinarily rich transfer of concepts between the fields of algebraic number theory and algebraic function theory”). Though it’s quite clear that this kind of analogical reasoning plays an important role in the development of mathematics, traditional “proof-based” philosophies of mathematics have little to say about the subject; nor, in connection with Corfield’s earlier discussion, do we have any idea how to teach computers to understand such reasoning.

Chapters 5–6, discuss plausible reasoning in mathematics. There are long-standing problems here. Mathematicians are—as Corfield emphasizes in an interesting series of examples and case studies—pretty good at plausible reasoning. They evaluate the plausibility of conjectures; they argue about whether certain proof-strategies are likely to “pan out”; they discuss the likelihood that specific analogies will turn out to be fruitful. Unfortunately, it’s hard to see how they do all this. It’s not, as Corfield rightly emphasizes, a simple matter of enumerative induction (the fact that we have “tested” billions of instances of the Riemann Hypothesis, has only a little to do with the general feeling that the hypothesis is true). Nor do standard probabilistic models help: since mathematical theorems are necessary, and since they usually follow logically from our other beliefs, normal probabilistic models simply don’t apply.3

Corfield tracks these problems through a number of concrete examples—including a nice discussion of the famous “Monstrous Moonshine” conjecture. He concludes that most versions of Bayesian decision theory are simply useless in the mathematical context, though he holds out hope that a (suitably tweaked) version of Polya’s program might lead to modest insights. More interestingly, he argues that the difficulties facing Bayesianism in mathematics may bleed over into natural science. In many cases, physicists develop conjectural (and often non-rigorous) mathematics which mathematicians only later (and often much later) put on a rigorous footing. This leads to back-and-forth plausibility arguments between physics and mathematics. Initially, the purely mathematical conjectures look plausible, because they have been so useful in physics. Later, the physics itself seems more plausible, because it led to correct “predictions” in mathematics.

The last four chapters of Corfield’s book focus on the historical growth of mathematics. Corfield is a big fan of Lakatos, and he spends a fair bit of time defending Lakatos against various criticisms in the literature. In the end, though, Corfield admits that Lakatos’ work needs substantial modification. It needs far closer (and more sophisticated) analyses of the details of mathematical history; it needs a better understanding of the various ways research programs can be organized;4 it needs a more nuanced view of the (often quite positive) role that axioms play in mathematics.5 The book ends with two long case studies. Chapter 8 focuses on debates about the centrality of the groupoid concept (is it just an unmotivated abstraction, or is it a powerful tool for capturing fundamental mathematical symmetries, a tool which might one day replace the concept group in many contexts?). Finally, chapter 9 looks at the potential role of n-categories in structuring and organizing future mathematics.

What should we make of all this material? On the one hand, there’s a lot to like about Corfield’s book. It presents a wide array of mathematical examples and cases studies—both contemporary and historical—and these studies are usually informative, fascinating to read, and, in a broad sense, philosophically suggestive. Further, Corfield’s expository skills are top notch: even readers who don’t know much core mathematics can get the general point of his examples and follow the overall structure of his argument. Finally, I think Corfield is simply right on his main point: philosophy of mathematics would be greatly enriched if more philosophers knew more mathematics. If Corfield’s book inspires young philosophers to take more courses in core mathematics, then it will have performed a genuine service. If they are able to apply their knowledge of core mathematics to generate new philosophical problems and/or solve old ones, then Corfield’s book will turn out to be something of a watershed.

On the other hand, the book has (at least) two serious flaws. First, Corfield never seriously engages his opponents. Although he takes frequent pot-shots at contemporary research programs in the philosophy of mathematics—modalism, fictionalism, neo-logicism, Platonism—Corfield never really explains these programs or considers the arguments their proponents have put forward. Instead, he contents himself with quick, and almost completely unsupported, dismissals (rival projects are “dead to the way mathematicians think,” filled with “silly questions,” etc.). Similarly, though Corfield is harshly critical of mathematical foundationalism, he doesn’t explore why philosophers might find this position attractive or what arguments they have given for it. Nor does he attempt to distinguish cases where the much-reviled “foundationalist filter” might be appropriate (say, in connection with various metaphysical issues) from cases where it simply impedes philosophical understanding (say, when examining the historical development of category theory). At the end of the day, then, I’m left with the feeling that many of Corfield’s criticisms are simply unfair and that almost all of them are unearned.

Second, I don’t think Corfield is particularly successful at generating serious philosophy out of reflection on core mathematics. At many points, he seems to simply assume that pieces of cutting-edge mathematics (or mathematical history) will have philosophical payoffs, and he then substitutes a (admittedly, very nice) description of this mathematics for actual discussion of the purported payoffs. In his introduction, for instance, Corfield points out just how drastically Euclidean geometry has been reinterpreted over the last few centuries—e.g., in becoming just “one particular species of geometry” among others, and in the kinds of high-powered machinery applied to it (Lie groups, principle bundles, etc.). This discussion is supposed to highlight the inadequacy of limiting our philosophical reflection to classical Euclidean geometry. Unfortunately, although Corfield waves around a lot of fancy mathematics in making this point, he never actually explains why this mathematics is philosophically important (i.e., what new philosophical insights we get from thinking about it).6

I have similar worries about Corfield’s later chapters. While some of his broad, thematic points are clearly philosophically suggestive—e.g., that we need a better understanding of analogical reasoning in mathematics and a better account of mathematical plausibility arguments—I don’t think Corfield’s own discussions go very far towards developing these suggestions. I don’t, for instance, come away thinking I understand more about analogical reasoning than I did when I started this book. As a result, I’m not convinced that Corfield’s lengthy case studies—interesting though they may be—add much to my overall philosophical understanding. Similarly, while Corfield’s long discussion of groupoids gestures at a real philosophical problem—what do mathematicians mean by “natural” objects and/or constructions—his actual analysis of naturalness is far too quick to be convincing (or even, to serve as a springboard for further research).

In the end, then, Corfield’s book is a good read and a wonderfully informative guide to certain bits of mainstream mathematics. I recommend it on that level. Further, it has the potential to inspire new philosophers to seek a more serious engagement with core mathematics; if this potential is realized, and if the resulting engagement produces philosophy of mathematics on a par with the best of recent philosophy of physics, then the book will have performed a real service. I only wish that more such philosophy was present in Corfield’s own book.


1. In conversation, I’ve heard several people describe Corfield’s book as “hostile” to foundational studies. I think this involves a misreading of Corfield’s position (though, unfortunately, some of Corfield’s rhetoric makes this misreading all-too understandable). As far as I can tell, Corfield has no objection to foundational studies per se; as far as they go, they’re an important contribution to the philosophy of mathematics. Corfield simply thinks that there are other kinds of study which are equally valuable, and that the current (over)emphasis on foundational issues tends to squeeze out these other subjects.

2. The sociological differences between philosophy of physics and philosophy of mathematics really are quite striking. At present, I think it would be difficult for a junior candidate in philosophy of physics to do well on the job market without being familiar with (at least some) high-end topics in theoretical physics—i.e., without genuinely understanding the technical details of such topics. In contrast, there’s almost no expectation that candidates in philosophy of mathematics will be equally familiar with contemporary work in, say, algebra, analysis, topology or geometry.

3. So, for instance, Bayesian theories typically assign probability 1 to all logical tautologies. This makes them useless for modeling plausible reasoning about whether a given statement is, in fact, a tautology. Similarly, suppose the strong Goldbach conjecture is false. Then elementary arithmetic proves that it’s false. So, typical Bayesian theories insist that we should reject Goldach’s conjecture with (at least) the same confidence as we accept elementary arithmetic. However, since we don’t know that elementary arithmetic disproves Goldbach, this conclusion comes much too fast. At the very least, this kind of Bayesian analysis doesn’t explain the actual reasoning mathematicians use in assessing the plausibility of things like Goldach’s conjecture.

4. So, some are organized around an axiomatic core, some around a general subject matter, some around the exploitation of a specific family of techniques, and some around the exploration of a certain deep analogy or conjecture.

5. Lakatos often writes as though axiomatization simply “fossilizes” a discipline. In contrast, Corfield argues that axiomatization often invigorates a discipline, spurring the development of new concepts and opening up new directions for inquiry. He illustrates this with examples from homology theory; similar examples could be drawn from recent work in homotopy theory.

6. Note: I’m not claiming such insights aren’t available (I actually suspect they are available, and I’d love to read about them some day). I’m simply claiming that Corfield doesn’t present such insights here.