Towards the Critique of Violence: Walter Benjamin and Giorgio Agamben

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Brendan Moran and Carlo Salzani (eds.), Towards the Critique of Violence: Walter Benjamin and Giorgio Agamben, Bloomsbury, 2015, 251pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472523242.

Reviewed by Jason Maxwell, Pennsylvania State University


Although his work assembles a dizzying array of thinkers and texts from the past and present, Giorgio Agamben's debt to Walter Benjamin should not be underestimated. When asked in a 1985 interview to reflect upon his initial introduction to Benjamin's writing in the 1960s, Agamben remarked that the German "immediately made the strongest impression on me: for no other author have I felt such an unsettling affinity" (5). Benjamin's "Critique of Violence," first published in 1921, ranks among the pieces that have had the strongest influence on Agamben's thought. The essay informs the entirety of Homo Sacer, Agamben's best-known work, and many of its key theoretical concepts, including "bare life," "pure means," and "pure violence," appear regularly throughout Agamben's corpus.

Towards the Critique of Violence responds to two growing needs: to gain deeper insight into Benjamin's essay and to grasp more firmly how this essay has informed Agamben's philosophy. Split into two sections -- the first comprising five essays focused solely on Benjamin's text, the second consisting of eight pieces dedicated to Agamben's engagement with Benjamin -- the collection boasts a range of insightful and unexpected approaches to these two thinkers. In their general introduction, editors Brendan Moran and Carlo Salzani assert that the "essays do not follow an editorial line," resulting in a collection where the pieces "are often in at least implicit disagreement with one another" (7). After reading the essays, I can confidently claim that the decision to refrain from exerting a heavy editorial hand was a smart one. Beyond generously allowing the contributors to pursue their own individual interests, the editors' decision signals a deep familiarity with the critical impulses animating the principle figures under examination.

Initial forays into the dense, elliptical prose of either Benjamin or Agamben reveal a stubborn fact: even a detailed, word-by-word analysis of individual texts cannot eliminate the sense that some key piece of information is missing. Cognizant of this fact, Alison Ross explains near the beginning of her essay that many of the crucial terms within "Critique of Violence" prove "substantially meaningless without the possibility of clarifying references to other pieces from the same period" (40). She laments that recent scholarship on "Critique of Violence" has tended to ignore Benjamin's other writings from the same period and has instead focused "obsessively on particular phrases from the violence-essay alone" (40). Accordingly, the first section of the collection attempts to domesticate the cryptic unwieldiness of "Critique of Violence" by situating it within the thinker's broader corpus and putting it in dialogue with Benjamin's contemporaries. While Ross seeks to correct previous critics' errors by pairing "Critique of Violence" with the 1924 essay "Goethe's Elective Affinities," Antonia Birnbaum looks to 1921's "Fate and Character" and 1928's The Origin of German Tragic Drama. In addition to employing "Goethe's Elective Affinities" for his critical ends, Moran reaches back to 1916's "On Language as Such and on the Language of Man." Meanwhile, Bettine Menke frames "Critique of Violence" by looking outside Benjamin's writing altogether. From her perspective, Benjamin's meditations on a politics of "pure means" can only be understood by placing it alongside the work of German philosopher and sociologist Helmuth Plessner.

In the second section, most of the entries adopt a similar strategy when trying to come to terms with Agamben's relationship with Benjamin. J. Colin McQuillan asserts that Agamben's fascination with sacrificial violence and his desire to find an alternative to it must be understood as an outgrowth of Benjamin's distinction between mythic and divine violence. McQuillan traces Agamben's fascination with "Critique of Violence" over the course of his career, beginning with the early 1982 text Language and Death and concluding with the recent 2012 Opus Dei. Paolo Bartoloni connects Benjamin's meditations on the pure means of the revolutionary proletarian strike with Agamben's treatment of Franciscan friars' practice of self-renunciation detailed in The Highest Poverty. Alex Murray argues that Agamben's engagement with Benjamin provides him with tools to launch an attack on Kant's critical project. Finally, William Watkin highlights features of Agamben's reading of "Critique of Violence" by contrasting it with Slavoj Žižek's treatment of the piece.

For readers whose familiarity with Benjamin does not extend far past well-worn sections of Illuminations or Reflections, the essays in the first section are a welcome addition to the ongoing effort to understand a notoriously dense entry in his canon. For critics primarily concerned with better understanding Agamben's relationship to Benjamin, numerous essays in the second section should help them form connections between his most famous politically-oriented works, most notably Homo Sacer and State of Exception, and the theologically-inflected examinations that have preoccupied him in recent years. While all of the entries in Moran and Salzani's collection have something to recommend them, the most compelling are those that, even if only implicitly, account for the simultaneously fascinating and frustrating experience of engaging with Benjamin's and Agamben's texts. As these pieces illuminate, the ambivalence one may feel when reading these thinkers invariably stems from their unusual and easily overlooked critical methodologies.

Several essays thoroughly document Benjamin's proclivity for deploying crucial signifiers in multiple and frequently contradictory ways. For instance, Birnbaum outlines two ways that Benjamin understands the concept of "fate" and its potential interruption, one concerning the "contestation of the arbitrary" and the other concerning "the incompletion of history" (91). She illustrates how the two definitions not only structure Benjamin's antagonism between ancient tragedy and baroque drama but also inform his meditations on the law, the commodity, and melancholy. Meanwhile, Moran demonstrates how the term "nature" serves multiple functions for Benjamin. Against previous critics, Moran insists that nature cannot simply be conflated with a mythical violence that rigidly condemns humans to a preordained fate, pointing out that Benjamin elsewhere associates nature with an innocence that resists such inevitability. Beyond outlining these two versions of nature, Moran points to a troubling tension that emerges from Benjamin's thought as a result. If Benjamin proposes that humanity can question the fate ascribed to it by the existing legal order, he also seems to intimate that those who fail to question this order belong to the majority of worldly phenomenon that silently surrender to fate. Moran concludes that Benjamin's decision to "engage in the very overnaming that he otherwise criticizes" unfairly characterizes not only entities like plants but also those humans who are described as "vegetative" (86).

Cleverly seizing upon the numerous ambiguities in Benjamin's writing, Ross raises the stakes by elaborating on the ambiguous nature of the word "ambiguity" within "Critique of Violence." On the one hand, Benjamin regards ambiguity as a central component of mythical violence; myth relies upon unclear symbols that make it impossible for human beings to know with any certainty how they might live properly and avoid prohibited behavior, thereby generating endless anxiety and guilt. On the other hand, Benjamin treats "ambiguity" in a different sense when he considers its function within ostensibly liberating bourgeois practices. Analyzing Goethe's 1809 novel Elective Affinities, Benjamin claims that while bourgeois life aims to flee the mythical violence that accompanies traditional social structures, it ultimately produces the same kinds of anxiety. Complicating matters even further, "ambiguity" in Benjamin's work does not merely waffle between these two negatively coded formulations. Indeed, Benjamin's later writing characterizes ambiguity in a much more positive light, framing it as "a gateway to the perception of historical truth" (51).

But the puzzling nature of Benjamin's text may persist even after unraveling a tightly packed term like ambiguity. Amir Ahmadi's contribution, an analysis of the Greek myth of Niobe within "Critique of Violence," reveals how Benjamin was willing to appropriate material and reengineer it for his own purposes. While Benjamin considers the story of Niobe to be an illustration of his ideas concerning mythical violence, Ahmadi asserts that the actual Greek myth includes crucial details that challenge Benjamin's account of it. After noting that Niobe's metamorphosis into stone following the death of her children does not result from guilt but instead from sorrow or shock, Ahmadi concludes that "The meaning Benjamin attributes to the story of Niobe does not so much reflect the features of the Greek myth as his programmatic and total opposition of 'myth' and 'theology'" (66). Ahmadi's analysis suggests that anyone aiming to make sense of "Critique of Violence" or any other text from Benjamin should not assume that he is performing faithful exegeses of other writers and artists. Simply put, familiarity with Benjamin's source material will not guarantee any kind of interpretive sure footing.

As other essays in the collection make clear, a similar disposition to reconfigure source material marks Agamben's writing. Working against misunderstandings that inevitably arise from the vicissitudes of translation, Salzani stresses that Benjamin's bloßes Leben and Agamben's la nuda vita should not be conflated. As Salzani maintains, Agamben's "readings of Benjamin are philologically very insightful, acute, and extremely original, to the point of becoming 'creative'" (109). Salzani demonstrates that Agamben's la nuda vita, rather than a concept plucked cleanly from "Critique of Violence," is ultimately more indebted to Carl Schmitt. "Bare life," as it is translated in English, refers more to the articulation of life as a form of exception than to a politics of taking exception to myth. Vivian Liska's essay resonates nicely with Salzani's by illuminating Agamben's willingness to reformulate Benjamin for his own ends. Liska contrasts Benjamin's and Agamben's respective readings of Kafka's parable "Before the Law." Whereas Benjamin differentiates between state law and Jewish law, Agamben seeks to equate them. Interestingly enough, when Agamben situates his reading of "Before the Law" against Jacques Derrida's, he claims to be simply reiterating Benjamin's interpretation of the story. But as Liska points out, Agamben actually recasts Benjamin, and Kafka along with him, in a decidedly Christian direction, effectively transforming them into disciples of the apostle Paul -- a far cry from the Jewish Messianic tradition that animates Benjamin's thoughts on Kafka.

Benjamin's and Agamben's creative reading practices inspire James R. Martel's entry, which uses these two figures to outline the prospects of anarchism in the present. From Martel's perspective, Agamben provides a series of concrete practices that complement Benjamin's abstract vision of relations between individuals that exist outside the state. While Martel's turn to anarchism may initially feel unsuitable -- particularly in light of Agamben's proclamation that the concentration camp constitutes the political paradigm of our moment -- his willingness to reorient Benjamin's and Agamben's texts in a new direction may actually be more faithful to these thinkers' work than if he were to simply rehash their arguments.

Rather than flaws to be lamented or eliminated, the implicit disagreements and contradictions among the pieces are perhaps the book's strongest quality in that they capture the spirit of Benjamin's and Agamben's writing better than any tidy analysis. For this reason, the collection is a valuable addition to the existing scholarship.