Tragedy, Recognition, and the Death of God: Studies in Hegel and Nietzsche

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Robert R. Williams, Tragedy, Recognition, and the Death of God: Studies in Hegel and Nietzsche, Oxford University Press, 2012, 410pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199656059.

Reviewed by Paul Redding, the University of Sydney


Robert Williams starts the introduction to this challenging collection by noting that "despite its appearance [it] is not a collection of essays conceived separately on isolated topics only recently gathered in a book" (p. 1). Many of the pieces have the look of independent "self-standing" essays, and a number of them have been published separately. But the reader quickly gets a sense of what Williams means. While in no sense forming a "monograph", the separate studies have a mutually referring, somewhat "organic", inter-dependence that recalls Williams' own characterization of Hegel's view of the world. The collection repays, and in some sense demands, moving back and forth across the chapters in order to build up a sense of the volume's complex thematic interdependencies. Williams says the project grew from an essay seeking to compare Hegel's and Nietzsche's views on the relation of master and slave. This essay, "Hegel and Nietzsche: Recognition and Master/Slave" is the first of three in Part I, "Recognition". This comparison and contrast between Hegel and Nietzsche proves fruitful in a number of senses, but especially for the task of showing how the theme of recognition runs deeper in Hegel than is often appreciated.

This theme of recognition will come as no surprise to those familiar with Williams's two earlier books devoted to Hegel's concept of recognition or "Anerkennung". Both Recognition: Fichte and Hegel on the Other and Hegel's Ethics of Recognition played important roles in the development of this "recognitive" approach to Hegel's philosophy as well as to philosophy more generally.[1] For decades, if an Anglophone philosopher had read anything by or about Hegel, it had probably concerned the so-called "struggle for recognition" from Chapter 4 of the Phenomenology of Spirit, viewed through the lens of the famous reading by Alexandre Kojève from the 1930s. But Hegel's philosophy tended to get reduced to a picture of society originating in and based upon a type of primordial struggle between otherwise isolated men, a picture diverging from the Hobbesian one by the peculiarity that in Hegel's account the struggle was driven not simply by desire and fear but by a specific type of desire, the "desire for recognition". Williams demonstrated the narrowness and inadequacy of this reduced reading of Hegel's concept of recognition.

Williams was not alone in taking up and developing the recognitive approach. From another direction, the theme of recognition was catching on via the efforts of Axel Honneth, whose approach had taken off from his Frankfurt School predecessor, Jürgen Habermas, but had soon come to develop its own distinctive flavour.[2] However, although pursued from the Frankfurt School perspective, the recognition theme has been mostly formulated and developed within a type of critical social and political philosophy, Williams's own approach has been much more explicit in framing the notion in more "metaphysical" and "theological" language. That is, the theme of recognition is seen not as simply relevant to Hegel's conception of intersubjectivity and to the individual's relation to her own "Sittlichkeit" -- the so-called "ethical substance" into which each is born. It is into these areas of "absolute" spirit that the idea of recognition is brought in these studies. This has been, I believe, an important development.

Besides those clues found in the title, the headings of the four main parts convey the sorts of issues treated. Thus, after the three chapters of Part I exploring different dimensions of the conception of recognition, the remaining chapters are parcelled out in three further parts: Part II, "Tragedy"; Part III, "Overcoming the Kantian Frame: The True Infinite"; and Part IV, "God Beyond the Death of God". Part II has one chapter on Hegel and one on Niezsche, Part III has two on Hegel, while the explicitly theologically oriented Part IV has three chapters on Hegel and two on Nietzsche. The recognition chapters of Part I are more mixed, with Chapter 1 comparing Hegel and Nietzsche, Chapter 2 examining Aristotle, Hegel and Nietzsche on friendship, and Chapter 3 focused on Nietzsche's exploration of contestationally based forms of community.

Overall, then, roughly seven of these studies relate to Hegel and five to Nietzsche, with religion and theology having the lion's share of the focus. This is indicated not only by the size (almost half the volume's length) of Part IV, but also by the inclusion of a study of Hegel's account of the traditional proofs of God as the second of the two chapters making up Part II. (I will come back to the other chapter in Part.) Part IV, "God Beyond the Death of God" includes, as one might expect, a chapter (Chapter 9) on the "death of God" theme in Nietzsche. For Nietzsche the idea of the death of God stood for the nihilistic process of the evisceration of all values in modernity, a process to which his doctrine of "eternal recurrence" was meant to respond. But this is paired with Chapter 10 on the less well-known Hegelian version of the idea that "God is dead". This initial pairing of Nietzsche and Hegel vis-à-vis their approaches to religion in the time of a collapse of a certain kind of religion, a form of Christianity built on a "legal-penal-juridical" picture of the world in which God is cast as a type of transcendent monarch, allows a comparison of the way they each responded to the "death of God" phenomenon by going back to ancient tragic consciousness. Nietzsche uses this in a critical dismissal of Christianity, but Hegel uses it as a basis from which to reconstruct a new liberal and yet "tragic" version of Christianity. Chapters 11 and 12 further develop this contrast between Nietzsche and Hegel, but clearly, as well, the theme of this interaction between Christianity and tragedy relates back to the chapters of Part II focusing on Nietzsche's and Hegel's specific takes on ancient tragedy itself. The chapters on the death of God also develop out of the first chapter of Part IV, which examines Hegel's relation to the "theogonic" approach to religion found in figures like Schelling.Williams is responding here to the relatively little-known interpretation of Hegel on religion by the 20th century Russian, Iwan Iljin.

Williams's sympathies are undoubtedly with Hegel, and often what he most appreciates in Nietzsche are views that he sees as approximating, but ultimately falling short of, Hegel's views. As one might gather, Williams has little time for the standard caricatures of both philosophers, which see them as occupying opposing ends of the philosophical spectrum: Hegel the ultimate metaphysician in contrast to Nietzsche the ultimate anti-metaphysician. For some traditionalists, I suspect that Williams's Hegel will be too Nietzschean and for many Nietzscheans, his Nietzsche too Hegelian, but Williams presents his interpretations, comparisons and analyses systematically and persuasively and with an enviable command of the texts. Williams's own interpretations of each philosopher emerge from these studies expressing, I believe, his own quite singular stance. The various parameters of these interpretations are brought into focus and held there by virtue of an on-going critical dialogue maintained with a variety of contemporary and past interpreters of Hegel, Nietzsche or both. The result is certainly a complex picture, but Williams skillfully manages to keep the various threads of his presentation and argument clear throughout. This book is a major achievement based on years of thoughtful engagement with these fascinating philosophers.

I have tried to convey something of this complex book by suggesting some of the links between the various themes that emerge when Hegel's concept of Anerkennung is extended from the restricted realm of social philosophy ("objective spirit") to religion and theology qua "absolute spirit". But absolute spirit also includes, quite obviously, the topic of philosophy itself, and here Williams has to engage to some degree with contemporary understandings of Hegel's philosophy as such. Here, the title of Part III, "Overcoming the Kantian Frame: The True Infinite" signals the place that Williams sees himself occupying. As he notes, one popular strategy in the recent Hegel revival in philosophy has been to portray him as in some sense continuing Kant's "Copernican Revolution". While Williams wants to give some weight to what Hegel learnt from Kant's critique of "traditional metaphysics", he is firmly opposed to what is generally described as the "post-Kantian" reading of Hegel and identified with the influential work of Robert Pippin. To adopt such a view is, on Williams's reading, to ascribe an overly modern and "subjective" orientation to Hegel, to miss the depths of the Nietzsche-like critique of modern nihilism that sends Hegel back to the lessons of ancient tragedy with which he transforms Christianity. In short, the post-Kantian reading can only go in the direction of a Feuerbach who reduces God to an anthropological postulate.

In contrast, Williams wants to escape this modern subject-centred outlook and attribute to Hegel a more substantial realist "metaphysics" than that which, he thinks, results from the post-Kantian route. And along with this he wants to give Hegel's theology a more substantive role in this metaphysics. My guess is that he will have more supporters for the first of these moves than he has for the second. Williams cites Frederick Beiser's criticisms of Pippin in support of his own. But in general those invoking a type of realist metaphysics here are likely to have in mind something more along the lines of ametaphysica generalis than the type of metaphysica specialis that seems closer to that required to accommodate the metaphysical role Williams assigns to Hegel's God.[3]

Leaving aside for the moment this vexed question of how to understand Hegel's "metaphysics", both realists and post-Kantians who wish to read Hegel from a more secular perspective can point to the distinction that Hegel draws between the conceptual presentations of philosophy and what is often described as the "imagistic" or "picture-language" forms of representation (Vorstellungen) characteristic of religion. I suspect, however, that Williams thinks of the relation between philosophical and theological presentations differently than do many others. As I read Williams, he wants to relate philosophical and religious forms of presentation in a way that gives relatively equal billing to each. For example, at one point Williams says that "religion provides the crucial counterpoint of speculative philosophy, because it provides the fundamental speculative intuition" (p. 185), which makes it sound like the process of conceptualizing Vorstellungen can only go so far, and that philosophy must rely on a background of religious "intuitions".[4] Moreover, I think that for those leaning towards the post-Kantian interpretation in particular, the type of discourse that Williams thinks of as "conceptual" and as making up Hegel's "metaphysics" might be regarded as still belonging to the realm of Vorstellungen. Regardless of those shortcomings of Kant criticized by Hegel, shortcomings to which "post-Kantian" readers like Pippin are surely alive, the position in Kant from which many are in general unwilling to retreat concerns his interrogation of the epistemological status of the sorts of claims traditionally advanced by metaphysics. Williams quotes Pippin's criticism of another realist interpreter of Hegel in terms of resorting to "pious paraphrase of text" and "impenetrable Hegelese" (p. 18), a criticism that, I believe, signals a quite different attitude that "post-Kantian" readers, in comparison to Williams, typically hold towards Hegel's actual texts.

To me it is hard to resist the idea that, among those contemporary readers who find something philosophically important in Hegel's texts, there are some who are willing to bring to the task of understanding Hegel a type of religious sensibility and some who are not. The latter, perhaps having, if you like, a "tin ear" for religious discourse, or perhaps insisting that their own religious beliefs and commitments be kept distinct from their philosophical ones, will want to translate as much as they can of what they think of as Hegelian Vorstellungen into something they see as conceptual rather thanVorstellungish. And this will include much more of Hegel's texts than his overtly religious claims. Williams treats Hegel's appropriation of Kant's critical philosophy as ruling out a type of metaphysics in which the absolute is presented as a type of "large entity", but takes this as leaving open the possibility of other objective general descriptions of the world, the world as process or "becoming", for example. However, I suspect that the post-Kantians would have these purportedly objective metaphysical descriptions in their critical sights as well.

The frustration expressed by Pippin (quoted above) appeared in a discussion of Hegel's conception of the "true infinite", a concept that Williams quotes Hegel as describing as "the basic concept of philosophy" (p. 18). That post-Kantians seem willing to downplay the importance of such core concepts is, Williams thinks, surely a symptom of their blindness to Hegel's realist metaphysics. But could it not also be read as expressing a genuine puzzlement about how Hegel's peculiar language in such cases is to be understood, and a resistance to simply being satisfied with what is regarded as untranslated Vorstellungen? Williams devotes Chapter 6 to expounding this concept, which is then brought into relation to Hegel's theological views by relating it in Chapter 7 to his take on the ontological proof. But I must admit to the difficulty of understanding exactly how to take the descriptions charting Hegel's account of the true infinite. In this sense I agree with Williams that they rely on being related to a kind of speculative intuition that is paradigmatically found in religious culture, but suggest that this may be because such "conceptual" accounts actually belong to the realm of Vorstellungen in the first place, rather than to conceptually based argumentation. This is not to say that Williams simply recycles "Hegelese"; quite the opposite. He is as skillful as any interpreter I know in cashing out Hegel's odd prose into accessible English. But this is not the point; Vorstellungen in Hegel's account need not be particularly exotic or metaphorical, and translating Vorstellungen into concepts is not reducible to rendering metaphor into plain or literal discourse.

In Chapter 3 Williams treats the contest, agon, as a form of mutual recognition, and in his treatment of Hegel's conception of absolute spirit, stresses opposition and conflict as irreducible. I would like to think of this Nietzschean point to which Williams draws attention as importantly true in philosophy, where opposition and conflict signal a healthy resistance to the "rule of one". Williams's is a provocative book that, I hope, will provoke many to take up the challenges it poses to, among many other things, contemporary conceptions of philosophy itself.

[1] Robert R. Williams, Recognition: Fichte and Hegel on the Other (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992), and Hegel's Ethics of Recognition (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1997).

[2] Axel Honneth, The Struggle for Recognition: The Moral Grammar of Social Conflicts, trans. Joel Anderson (Oxford: Polity Press, 1995).

[3] See for example, Robert Stern’s comments on Beiser and the possibilities for avoiding a “slide into an objectionable metaphysica specialis” in Robert Stern, Hegelian Metaphysics (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2009), p. 31. While Williams will insist that Hegel’s panentheistic God is not a fully “transcendent” one, his idea of Hegel’s “Absolute” still seems far from Beiser’s blander “universe as a whole”, to which Stern appeals. Such problems aside, Williams here follows Beiser in the idea that the presence of any Hegelian theology surely implies a realist metaphysics, but why this is the case seems to be taken as obvious and without the need of argument.

[4] The type of “speculative intuition” that Williams seems to have mind is what he elsewhere speaks of as an “experience of ecstatic inclusion” (p. 284) -- that is, an experience of belonging to not this or that social group, but to the universe as a whole. He is well aware that for Hegel no such experience can play a foundational role and that taken in isolation will be an instance of what he criticized in Schelling as the “night in which all cows are black”. It is not clear to me, however, why such experiences would not in Hegel go the way of the type of sensory “givens” that Kant himself insisted constrain conceptuality (as the content of empirical intuitions). They will of course continue to play somerole in cognitive life as elements, aufgehoben, but will they play the strong role that Williams assigns them?