Transcritique: On Kant and Marx

Placeholder book cover

Kojin Karatani, Transcritique: On Kant and Marx, trans. Sabu Koshu, MIT, 2003, 336pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262112744

Reviewed by Hans-Herbert Kogler, University of North Florida, Jacksonville/Universitat Klagenfurt, Austria


In Transcritique: On Kant and Marx Kojin Karatani undertakes the ambitious project of actualizing Marxism—both in the sense of ’updating’ it and bringing out its full potential—by reading Kant with Marx and Marx with Kant. The idea behind such cross-fertilization of thinkers seemingly radically opposed is to give Marxism its badly needed ethical orientation, while similarly presenting Kant’s ’transcendental critique’ as a methodological ground for Marx’s critique of capitalism. Indeed, the bulk of the book attempts a close reading of both Kant and Marx to show that an adequate understanding of each brings out hidden, usually invisible dimensions of both. Such cross-reading not only pushes both toward a ’common ground’—the space of what Karatani calls ’transcritique’—but furthermore suggests a viable alternative to purely normative or purely socio-economic criticisms of global capitalism. Radical theoretical alternatives to the capitalist model of economy, with perhaps the exception of Hardt’s and Negri’s Empire, are currently hard to come by. This project presents thus a timely and highly inspiring attempt to point to a space ’beyond capitalism’, a space sketched realistically as it is grounded in a disillusioned acceptance of the world-disclosing power of the capitalist economy as much as it is fine-tuned to its inner workings. It is fascinating, indeed, to see how an academically rich and well-informed reconstruction of thinkers like Kant and Marx can be made to speak to pressing current issues, namely the development of alternatives to global exploitation and the unjust distribution of wealth. The book´s major achievements are, first, a compelling cross-reading of ethical and social-theoretical (precisely: socio-economic) perspectives, and, second, a beginning of an answer to the question of how we can effectively challenge the capitalist system from within by means of an alternative understanding of ’economics.’ The few questions we are going to raise in the following more detailed discussion should thus by no means curtail the basic endorsement that this project deserves. Karatani´s book makes an important contribution to the reconstruction of current systems of economic power as a necessary presupposition for ethically motivated paths toward their ’immanent transcendence.’

To begin with, the forging of a new position from Kant/Marx is presented as ’transcritique.’ The term designates a methodological approach, inasmuch as the perspective Kant/Marx evolves from the reflexive movement in-between their positions. Similarly, each thinker is taken to exemplify this approach on his own. Kant and Marx are interpreted as creating perspectives that refuse fusion or arrest into new ’systems,’ existing rather in the oscillation between opposed or contradictory perspectives. For Karatani, such ’trans-critique’ is made possible by, and exercised through, the reflexive movement in-between cultures, communities, and cognitive perspectives. In this vein, Kant and Marx become anti-foundational master-thinkers of unearthing presuppositions, which in turn is explained by their outsider-position vis-à-vis their subject matter and context. Karatani illustrates this by Kant’s refusal to become a state philosopher by remaining in Königsberg, and through Marx’s outsider-position vis-à-vis the German, the French, and the British cultures respectively. More importantly, he suggests that Kant oscillates between, rather than ’sublates,’ rationalism and empiricism, while Marx is taken to stand in between Ricardo (emphasizing the production sphere of capitalism) and the unjustly forgotten Bailey (emphasizing the circulation sphere as value-generating). For Marx, stepping outside of Germany and experiencing economic crisis brought about an “awakening, accompanied by a certain shock. This was to see things neither from his own viewpoint, nor from the viewpoint of others, but to face reality that is exposed through difference (parallax)” (3). Kant, in turn, “continuously confronted the dominant rationalism with empiricism, and the dominant empiricism with rationalism. The Kantian critique exists within this movement itself” (4) Such a methodological outsider- or in-between position allows both thinkers to radically question the existing presuppositions shared by their contemporaries. Moreover, Karatani (if implicitly) applies this approach self-reflexively, as he moves between Kant and Marx from the ’interstice’ of a Japanese-Western context.

The second major similarity between Kant and Marx, as I read Karatani, consists in their understanding of reality as mediated by forms. What appears in Kant as categorial and intuitive forms of experience, and in Marx as value form, finds a common source in a conception of experience—and thus of subjective thought and individuality—as pre-constructed by media. I would consider this claim toward a mediation of experience—whether in the symbolic form of cognitive categories or in the economico-symbolic form of money—as the essential move toward relating Kant and Marx. This is because this step allows for a complex, and for the author central, analysis of reality as a ’necessary illusion.’ With Kant, we can establish that experience is mediated, and as such constitutes a categorial construction of objects that appear as necessary, while being nonetheless constructed through a symbolic medium that remains implicit. The experience is illusion, but at the same time (perceived as) necessary. This insight is applied to Marx’s analysis of capitalism, inasmuch as the true mechanism that produces value is both illusionary, necessary, and implicit. In compelling passages of rereading Marx, we are told about the intrinsically religious, since projective and illusionary character of capitalist economy, which entails its own metaphysics and religion in commodity fetishism.

Third, the reconstruction of the mediated nature of capitalist economy enables a subtle position in-between a determinism cementing the status quo and a revolutionary project of a wholesale overthrow of capitalism (a position admittedly not much defended today). The source of capitalism’s possible demise can be seen, again, most clearly with Kant (!) who, while giving us tools to see how something constructed can appear as necessary, nonetheless shies away from mistaking the constructed appearance (phenomenon) for the thing-in-itself (noumenon). In this gap between appearance and the thing-in-itself resides an essential possibility to challenge, revise, and transcend the current order. Moreover, Kant addresses the need to go beyond the mere experience of appearances in the ethical domain, where his categorical imperative gives immediate proof of the law of reason. The Kantian path to ethical transcendence is crucial, first, since it suggests the content of the categorical imperative (in the famous third formulation), i.e. never to treat another merely as a means, but always also as an end. Moreover, Karatani maintains that this shows that Kant situates this ethical demand squarely in the emerging capitalistic order, as the imperative to treat another never merely as a means is clearly taking into account the capitalistic mode of instrumental action, in which others are economically reduced to mere means. For Karatani (here similar to Frankfurt School Marxism), the Marxian enterprise makes sense only against the backdrop of a normative vision, which is implicitly entailed in concepts such as exploitation, alienation, revolution, and, of course, communism, and which can be explicated with reference to Kant. Kant’s moral imperative, combined with his appearance/thing-in-itself distinction, allows us to conceptualize the possibility of projecting alternative orders and practices, while accounting, still, for the capitalistic order as a necessary experiential frame for social life.

So far, so good. We might now be more willing to accept Kant and Marx as possible companions in the (trans-) critique of capitalism. But this big picture needs a lot of filling in, which is precisely what the interpretive analyses of the book are about. Perhaps the true originality of the approach consists not even in the just outlined broad ’fusion,’ but rather in the specific moves and models that are employed as the picture is painted in the text. Yet here we also encounter difficulties which, in part, arise from the interpretive decision to make this a ’trans-critical’ text between Kant and Marx alone, that is, to be almost fixated on fitting each and every move into a scheme that allows as true parameters only Kant or Marx.

We already explained how the ’common ground’ for moving from Kant to Marx and back again is provided through an account of symbolic mediation. Indeed, both Kant and Marx are explicated with regard to frequently invoked structuralist or holistic models of language (references range from Cassirer to Saussure, Jakobson, and Wittgenstein). Karatani does not only read Kant or Marx closely, but fills this reading with numerous, indeed at times exuberant references to other theorists and ideas, either to support or to contrast the idea at stake. Again, what is most important here seems to be the symbolico-holistic reading of media such as Kant’s synthetic a priori as a necessary illusion to constitute reality, and the subsequent interpretation of the capitalist medium of money as the dominating value form for capitalism. But the fact that such a crucial dimension—the theory of symbolic mediation—is merely invoked whenever suitable in order to support Kant/Marx means also that it is never explicated as such. Perhaps the transcritical space between Karatani and this reviewer reveals that the true movement in this text is not between Kant and Marx, but between Kant/Marx and the linguistic turn, which would have required a more full-blown explication. Perhaps, then, certain questions concerning the specific and doubtlessly original readings of Kant and Marx could have been addressed better.

With regard to Kant, it is not clear how Karatani’s re-reading succeeds in grounding the notion of objectivity he wants to derive from Kant. The problem arises because Karatani’s Kant is taken to base ’objectivity’ on the relation to the other: “Kant has been criticized for his subjective method. But in fact, his thought is always haunted by the perspective of the other” (2). For Karatani’s Kant, only the other can unleash the critical potential inherent in the concept of the thing-in-itself: “It is not the thing that negates (falsifies) a scientific hypothesis; it is not the thing but the future others who speak… What Kant implied by the thing-in-itself was the alterity of the other that we can never take for granted and internalize just on our whim or at our convenience” (51). But if it is the perspective-of-the-other that allows for critical transcendence of subjective viewpoints, and if, in line with ’transcritique,’ the other’s truly challenging viewpoint derives from being situated differently, the source of a shared ’objective’ view is, instead of being grounded, radically thrown into doubt. Karatani suggests that “(d)ialogue… is that which occurs between others who do not share a common set of rules… (73). But if the rules defining my own and the other’s background understanding are different, and if this is a necessary condition for true criticism, the notion of ’objectivity’ cannot be the one that Kant, by reconstructing a transcendental ground of enabling empirical knowledge, had in mind. Whether Karatani wants to suggest a Wittgensteinian open-endedness of language-game perspectives, a counterfactual ’regulative ideal’ at which all different perspectives are ultimately aiming at vis-à-vis the thing-in-itself, or whether some real fusion of different perspectives in dialogue can even be an option—the notion of objectivity is in need of further explication, especially in light of Karatani’s categorical dismissal of ’public consensus’ conceptions of truth.

With regard to Marx, I have doubts that Karatani’s theoretical reform of orthodox and structuralist Marxism goes far enough, or differently put, whether his rejection of economic reductionism suffices to capture the relative autonomy of culture. Karatani’s analysis culminates in the claim that capital, state, and nation form an intrinsically connected amalgam, so that any critique of capital in the name of state (social democracy) or nation (’third world’ independence movements) is doomed to fail. Most important, however, is the fact that “capital, state, and nation should be seen as different forms of human exchange, and not structured like the architectonic metaphor: base/superstructure”(204). Capital creates human relations through commodity exchange via money, the state is based on the principle of plunder and redistribution, and the nation is grounded in the principle of gift and return. Even though analytically independent, the value form of money allowed the forging of the synthesis of the modern capitalistic nation-state. At the same time, capitalism always remains parasitic on lifeworld backgrounds. Along those lines, Karatani develops an intra-Marxian critique that emphasizes the importance of the circulation sphere (market) over against the production sphere (labor), employing a relational conception of value as created through a commodity’s place in the system of circulation. He thus arrives at a reevaluation of the source of anti-capitalistic action, inasmuch as the true power of the worker resides in his role as consumer, on which capital essentially depends for the creation of surplus value. Workers must realize their power as consumers, and vice versa: “The opposition to a capitalist nation-state should neither be a worker’s movement nor a consumer’s movement; this should be a movement of workers qua consumers, and consumers qua workers. The movement has to be a transnational association of consumers/workers” (295). The goal is the creation of global ethico-economic associations, “association” being a fourth and quasi-utopian form of human exchange. The ethico-economic model combines moments from the state (equality), where strangers encounter one another, and the nation (fraternity), where subjects are empathetically concerned with one another (while thereby, I presume, allowing for free self-realization). This is the vision of a new, ethical mode of interaction where others are not reduced instrumentally, are not ’mere means’ (Kant), while the complex, anonymous, and economic organization of modern societies is taken into account. Karatani finds a realization of this model in LETS (Local Exchange Trading System), based on an interest-free conception of money.

Accordingly, Karatani argues that the exchange mode of money is but one of four forms of human interaction. Capitalism thus involves more than a narrowly defined economic infrastructure. Yet what we would need, then, is a more broadly conceived model of symbolic and cultural exchange, both to explain (economic) power and to point to a path of possible resistance. If capitalism is, indeed, “a certain force that regulates humanity beyond its intentionality, a force that divides and recombines human beings” which Marx attempted to “decode for the whole of human life” (5), than the Gandhian move toward alternative modes of economic exchange can be but a small beginning toward escape or transformation. If we take seriously that economic life is but one form of human exchange, needing to be theorized alongside other forms of symbolic mediation, we should accept that capitalism’s grip (or that of modern power in general) extends in different forms, including symbolic, psychological, and economic modes of oppression. The so-called postmodern theorists including Michel Foucault (on power) and Pierre Bourdieu (on symbolic capital and habitus), which Karatani ignores, could have taught valuable lessons in this regard. Thus, while Karatani’s Marxian self-critique contributes to our understanding of capitalism via the symbolic form of money, its true potential might only be realized if applied (trans-critically?) to more fine-grained theories of symbolic and cultural power.