Tropes, Universals and the Philosophy of Mind: Essays at the Boundary of Ontology and Philosophical Psychology

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Simone Gozzano and Francesco Orilia (eds.), Tropes, Universals and the Philosophy of Mind: Essays at the Boundary of Ontology and Philosophical Psychology, Ontos, 2008, 194pp., $107.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793831.

Reviewed by Keith Campbell, University of Sydney


This collection of essays is a welcome initiative from a group of philosophers involved with the Italian Society for Analytic Philosophy which reflects its robust health. The raison d'etre is an appealing one: the debate in the ontology of categories over the correct view to take on properties has reached something of a stand-off between the universalists and the particularists -- that is, between classical realists and trope theorists. (Classical nominalists are apparently an endangered species.) As they explain in an admirably straight-forward Introduction, it occurred to the book’s editors to try to move the debate forward by exploring what might be called applied ontology, in particular, by exploring whether one side or the other in the ontological debate performed better in the realm of the philosophy of mind. The work of David Robb on the virtues of tropes in providing an account of mental causation, itself a specimen of the strategy being promoted here, was at least part of what inspired them.

Nonreductive Materialism, and the problem of epiphenomenalism as one of its consequences, are the two themes most fully examined. The essays also at least touch on many other issues in philosophy of mind and related areas, e.g., language, and perception. For this reason, the book would be a suitable secondary text for an advanced course in metaphysics.

The book contains seven essays on these topics. In the first, John Heil (Robb's collaborator) provides a lucid discussion of the basic issues in ontology proper, prior to any application, of the notion of properties as particular. He argues that property particulars (modes in his vocabulary) are required in an adequate ontology, but does not urge a one-category position. The locus criticus in the philosophy of mind is the issue of the causal relevance of the mental -- how can states of mind make a difference in a world where all physical events have sufficient physical causes? -- so progress there will be the touchstone of the success of any applied ontology.

Anna-Sofia Maurin's theme, pursued through a close treatment of Robb and Heil and C. B. Martin, is that many problems in ontology and philosophy of mind arise from a faulty Picture Theory of meaning. But without an account of language as in some way or other reflecting or encapsulating the world's structure, ontology can not be pursued at all. So she offers a new Picture Theory: in the case of true propositions, the roles that real items must be able to play to make the proposition true are roles they can indeed play.

Francesco Orilia presents an extended discussion of the basic ontic issues, then tackles multiple realisability in the mind-body problem. His stalking horse is Non-Epiphenomenalist Non-Reductive Physicalism (NENRP), and he shows how different ontic positions offer different perspectives on its viability.

Ausonio Marras and Juhani Yli-Vakkuri entitle their piece "The 'Supervenience Argument': Kim's Challenge to Nonreductive Physicalism", and this is an exact description of its contents. It is a very closely and sharply reasoned dissection of the elements of Kim's argument(s), plus a "polemical" challenge to the concept of causation that is behind some of the difficulties nonreductive Physicalism faces.

Simone Gozzano offers a short and sweet paper arguing that if tropes are indeed simple, as some theorists (including Williams and myself) have urged, they can not help, and indeed must hinder, attempts at a token identity version of nonreductive Physicalism.

David Robb explores the possibility of zombies -- exact physical clones of people, yet lacking consciousness. He applies a basic ontology of tropes to the question of the possibility of various species of zombie -- dispositional, physical, behavioural, and functional. The two latter types are possible on the trope view, the two former not.

The work concludes with E. Jonathan Lowe's splendidly high-spirited and stylish demolition of Jerrold Levinson's linguistically based claim that there are not, and cannot be, any tropes. For good measure he recapitulates and expands, again against Levinson, D. C. Williams' original hint that tropes are very serviceable in any acceptable account of perception. This demonstration of the merits of tropes in the theory of perception is indeed one of the clearest cases of the book's program bearing fruit.

What overall verdict shall we pass on the whole enterprise? John Heil himself, in the first essay, expresses a principled reservation: Applying categorical ontology to the philosophy of mind will not be decisive, because for any presentation of a position with properties as particulars, there will be an equivalent corresponding formulation with properties as universals. Technically speaking, this may well be correct. But to my mind, it certainly does not reduce the value of the exercise to zero. It does not even very much diminish it. For if it be agreed that there are no knock-out blows in categorical ontology, then we must make our assessments as best we can, using the usual panoply of theoretical virtues as our guides. So the wider the range of issues on which rival accounts of properties offer rival analyses, the wider the range over which we can make comparisons between them. Where is one side neater than the other? Where must there be special pleading or an auxiliary hypothesis?

To appeal to prowess in resolving problems in the philosophy of mind as relevant to decision in first philosophy seems to me to be, in itself, entirely proper. It is reminiscent of the way in which the presence of enantiomorphs in our space bears on the more basic issue of realism or relationism in cosmology casting, as it does, a weight into the realist scale. Apart from Lowe on perception, there is at least one other place where the strategy seems to me to make real progress -- but in the opposite direction. Gozzano argues very effectively that the simplicity of tropes makes them unsuitable to be the items to be identified in any token-identifying version of nonreductive Physicalism. For the token-identifying strategy holds that a single item belongs at once to both a mental and a physical type. In trope theory, this involves belonging to two different similarity sets. But as a trope can have no more than one aspect, it cannot belong to two different kinds.

The moral is that the tokens involved in any nonreductive Physicalism are not simple tropes. The way forward here may involve developing some account of complex, yet still particular, modes. That is in any case appealing, as there is something suspiciously over-simple about taking individual tropes as the entities that are both mental and physical. For on the physical -- that is, brain -- side of the business, we already know that what corresponds to any recognizably mental condition is an immensely complicated and dynamic affair, with changes, events, processes, and alterations of conditions all tumbling over one another. That on the physical side we need to look for complex, dynamic items, also gives an air of unreality to the several discussions of Kim's treatment of the problems of nonreductive Physicalism which involve events as he construes them.

For Kim, an event is an ordered triple of object, universal property and time [x, F, t], again a static structure. Marras and Yli-Vakkuri bring out with great clarity that on this account of events, and with events as the entities involved in any proposed Physicalism concerning the mind, no nonreductive version can succeed. For if the events [x, F, t] and [y, G, t] are to be identified, it is necessary and sufficient that x = y, F = G, and t = t. But a nonreductive Physicalism precisely insists that F is not identical with G. That is what makes it nonreductive. If F = G, we have a reductive, type-identifying, Physicalism.

Even with the items to be identified sorted out, I think it fair to say that problems remain for nonreductive Physicalism: the issue of mental causation, of course, and the spectre of epiphenomenalism. None of these papers put that spectre to rest. Indeed reading the book has inclined me to think that so long as we adhere to Closure -- the doctrine that every physical effect has a sufficient physical cause -- the issue will not be resolved. That suggests that some version of double aspect theory, rather than a genuine Physicalism, might be worth re-exploring especially since Closure is also the great stumbling block in the Freewill issue.

The book has a sprinkling of typos. Most are merely irritating, but some affect the sense:

In the final paragraph of p79, 'reductive' appears twice where 'nonreductive' is meant.

In the second last line of p107, it is Figure 2 that is involved.

On p115, in the tenth line, we find p' and P' , where we need p and P.

The agreeable aspect of this is that it shows that the work as a whole passes the Stove Test, named for my late colleague at the University of Sydney, David Stove. The Stove Test runs: No philosophical writing is worth reading if you cannot be sure, at every point, that no typographical error has inserted or deleted a negative. It is particularly pleasing where a book includes papers by Continental philosophers, as Stove first proposed the Test to discourage the study of Parisian authors.