Truth and the Absence of Fact

Placeholder book cover

Field, Hartry, Truth and the Absence of Fact, Oxford University Press, 2001, 424pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-19-924289-5.

Reviewed by Richard Fumerton, University of Iowa


This book contains thirteen of Field’s previously published papers. The earliest was published in 1972; the latest, in 2000. The papers are loosely connected by their focus on various issues, global and more local, concerning truth and meaning. While for the most part the papers appear in their original published form, Field has added postscripts to eight of the papers. The postscripts vary considerably in length and contain amplification, clarification, or criticism of positions advanced in the original papers.

The five papers in Part 1 (Truth, Meaning and Propositional Attitudes) trace the evolution of Field’s thought from a somewhat sympathetic (though still critical) treatment of Tarski’s theory of truth, to a robust defense of an unabashedly deflationary account of both truth and meaning/content. The early discussion of Tarski developed concerns about a “hidden” reliance on unanalyzed semantic concepts. The deflationary account of the content of sentences, developed through a critical evaluation of Stalnaker’s views on intentionality and through Field’s two papers “Deflationary Views of Meaning and Content” and “Attributions of Meaning and Content,” is supposed to facilitate the development of a thoroughgoing deflationist program in which semantic concepts that appear in deflationary accounts of truth, themselves get a deflationary treatment. Although Field vigorously defends views, he is also particularly skilful at mapping the relevant differences in alternative approaches to understanding truth and content, and is refreshingly candid in conceding that there are sometimes no knock-down arguments in favor of one approach over another.

There is one non-negotiable constraint on Field’s willingness to take a philosophical position seriously: the position must be compatible with a hardheaded materialism. That materialism entails “that there be no irreducible mental objects or mental properties” (30). One of Field’s main projects is to solve, or dissolve, what he calls Brentano’s problem—the problem of how to give a materialistic account of intentionality.

The papers in Part 2 (Indeterminism and Factual Deflationism) deal with less global issues, focusing on problematic contexts for the ascription of truth and meaning. Field argues that one can accommodate insights about indeterminacy of translation, indeterminacy with respect to the referents of terms over theory change, and apparent failure of excluded middle, not only from within the framework of traditional correspondence theories of truth, but also presupposing the kind of minimalist, deflationary accounts of truth and content that Field now favors.

In Part 3 (Objectivity), issues of objectivity are again engaged. The first two papers address issues concerning the status of mathematical truths and mathematical objects, and the relation between the decidability of a mathematical sentence and that sentence’s having a determinate truth value. The topic of the last paper in this section is only tenuously connected with the topics of the first two. It begins with a characterization of the a priori as that which can be reasonably believed without empirical evidence and is empirically indefeasible (at least for computationally ideal epistemic subjects). Just as Field argues that certain well-formed mathematical sentences lack truth-value, so he appears to argue (more on this later) for a noncognitivist account of certain a priori sentences endorsing the legitimacy of fundamental principles of reasoning.

It is obviously impossible to summarize adequately, let alone evaluate, the diverse, often dense and technical papers that make up this collection. The papers are among the most important and influential writings on truth and meaning. One also gets a valuable and interesting insight into the ways in which, and reasons for which, an important philosopher’s views change over time. The postscripts, in particular, highlight issues that were pivotal for Field. The insight gained is enhanced by Field’s candor, which leads him to admit when he is genuinely uncertain and when he sees complications or problems for his views.

Rather than try to say a bit about a great many issues, I’ll raise just a few questions about a couple of themes. I’ll focus primarily on Field’s most recent deflationary views on truth and content and on his papers on apriority as an evaluative concept.

Before raising these more particular concerns, however, I want to comment in passing on Field’s resolute commitment to materialism. There is, of course, nothing wrong with a philosopher’s simply announcing presuppositions of an approach and working within the framework defined by those presuppositions. In the interest of full disclosure, I should indicate, however, that most of the views I take to be true are dismissed by Field in footnotes. I would have liked a more extensive discussion of just what is and is not supposed to be consistent with a thoroughgoing materialistic worldview. Cartesian mental substance is out, and so are irreducibly mental properties. But what makes a property irreducibly, and thus problematically, mental? Is it that the predicate expressions in question cannot plausibly be construed as co-referential with predicate expressions favored by one or more of the physical sciences? Of course, neurophysiologists employ both the language of “folk psychology” and the more technical vocabulary of their specialized field. Qua neurophysiologists, I don’t think that they are particularly competent to evaluate philosophical views about property identity.

In a way it seems to me a bit odd for a deflationist to worry all that much about when predicate expressions are or are not problematic. After all, one gives the same deflationary account of the content of “pain” that one gives of the technical predicates employed by the neurophysiologist. Certainly, for most people, including neurophysiologists, the inferential role and indication relations (Field’s suggestion for replacing meaning as truth conditions with something else) seem to be quite different for sentences about pain than they are for descriptions of neural events—most of us think that we can know truths about when we are in pain in ways in which we cannot know propositions describing neural events, for example.

Are properties respectable posits for a materialist or must we favor sets? If properties are OK, can a self-respecting materialist construe those properties as universals? Apparently, it’s all right to include within one’s materialist ontology sentence types as necessary existents (120, note 18), but it’s hard to see how such philosophical commitments are any less mysterious than the property dualist’s irreducible thoughts – posits that play for the dualist precisely the same role as the “internalized” intrinsically unambiguous sentences (135) that can bear truth value for Field.

Deflationary Accounts of Truth and Content

Let me make a few polemical remarks about Field’s deflationary account of truth and meaning/content, remarks that may indicate that I am still in the grips of an inflationist illness Field is trying to cure. According to Field, we need to explain the “conceptual necessity” of both sentences of the form:

1) “p” is true iff p


2) “p” means that p

The first difficulty, of course, is that, 1) and 2) are obviously not necessary. There are clearly possible worlds in which the symbols “Grass is green” don’t mean that grass is green and, consequently, aren’t true when and only when grass is green. Field is clearly aware of the problem and for that reason modifies his deflationary accounts so that they apply to sentences understood a certain way. What is necessarily true are the following:

1a) “p” (as I now understand it) is true iff p


2a) “p” (as I now understand it) means that p.

Consider 2a). Even it is not a necessary truth unless we take the parenthetical description as a “rigid” description of our particular understanding of “p”. If we do, however, then isn’t 2a) really equivalent to something like the following:

2b) “p” (when it means that p) means that p.

Leaving aside the fact that the symbols might not exist, we do now have a plausible candidate for a conceptual truth, but we have achieved our goal by reducing our account of meaning to an utterly trivial tautology providing no philosophical insight into meaning. The inflationist about truth and meaning is surely going to argue that the analogous account of truth, relying as it does, on our understanding of an interpreted sentence, implicitly explains the truth of a sentence by appealing to the fact that it derivatively shares the truth of the thought/proposition/content/understanding that it conveys.

Why are inflationists so frustrated with the deflationist’s account of truth and meaning? I suspect that the heart of the concern may lie with the inflationist’s conviction that we must distinguish two importantly different ways in which one thing can represent (stand for, be about) another. Language, for example, represents by convention. We assign meanings to words and other symbols. But we can only do so if we have some independent way of representing that which we want symbols to conventionally represent. If the “language” of thought itself represents only conventionally we would be threatened with a vicious regress. Russell and Frege sought (in different ways) to end the regress with nonconventional representation of a sort that Field dismisses as utterly mysterious. Causal theorists seek to end the regress in a way that greatly expands the class of items that refer naturally (independently of convention). Deflationists unapologetically seem to have nothing to say about how one thing succeeds in representing or standing for another.

Field’s internalized sentences seem to me to be suspiciously like internalized Fregean thoughts. Unlike ordinary sentences they are intrinsically unambiguous. They don’t seem anything like the more familiar marks or sounds that constitute the sentences of a natural language. Field is unimpressed by the difference. After all, marks and sounds themselves aren’t that much like each other either. But the differences go beyond the “stuff” out of which the “language” is constituted. Internalized sentences come with their constituent “terms” intrinsically tied to their contents in a way in which the words of a natural language are not. When one introduces a truth bearer this mysterious, perhaps one shouldn’t disparage too strongly the dualist who introduces some admittedly very odd properties to perform the very odd job that Field wants internalized sentences to perform.

Before concluding these few very brief and far too crude comments on deflationary accounts of meaning and truth, let me add one more minor reservation about the way in which Field talks about intentional states. At least sometimes, Field seems to suggest that our intentional states like beliefs and desires are relations we stand in to sentences (55, 109). This strikes me as a kind of category mistake. If you told me that someone desired a sentence, I would think that a very odd sort of desire indeed. It seems to me that a more plausible view would be the analogue of a kind of adverbial analysis of mental states. There are these internalized sentences but they are a genus that comes in different species. Some internalized states are beliefs, others are fears, others are desires, and so on. They all have meaning (captured by the deflationary theory) but the sentence comes “typed” as a belief sentence, a fear sentence, or a desire sentence.

The Evaluative Character of Fundamental Epistemic Claims

Field’s account of the modal status of fundamental principles of reasoning is both interesting and original. As I indicated earlier, he appears to develop a noncognitivist account of our “endorsement” of fundamental rules of reasoning, an account that rejects both the alleged mysteries of a priori intuition and the reliabilist’s efforts to turn principles of reasoning into empirical claims about the truth-conduciveness of certain ways of producing beliefs.

Given that it has become almost a mantra for many contemporary epistemologists that epistemic concepts (like justification) are normative, it’s a bit surprising that noncognitivist accounts of epistemic judgments are not more commonplace. The paradigm of a normative judgment, after all, is an ethical judgment and some philosophers interested in metaethics have long taken seriously the idea that there is a fundamental distinction between ethical sentences that have prescriptive meaning and other sorts of sentences that have descriptive meaning. The sharpest contrast between the two sorts of meanings was drawn by philosophers like Hare who claimed that moral statements are grammatically disguised imperatives.

Now it is not clear to me that Field really is a noncognitivist concerning the evaluation of rules of inferences. At least some of the time his emphasis seems to be on goals or ends, where evaluation involves judgments about the way in which to achieve these goals or ends. On such a view, one can indeed argue that as a factual matter one method of forming beliefs is better than another relative to one’s goals or ends (defined in terms of one’s fundamental values). Field says as much himself:

But nothing I have said implies that no standards are better than others. Indeed, some clearly are better. Of course, in saying that makes them ‘better’ I am presupposing a goal… . (382)

But if there are facts about what we value (what our goals are) and facts about what maximizes satisfaction of goals or ends, then there are facts about which methods of forming beliefs are good. Relativism is not noncognitivism. One can turn this goal-oriented account of the content of epistemic evaluative claims into a version of noncognitivism by invoking the old emotivist distinction between expressing and describing values, or by invoking a prescriptivist understanding of value claims. But I’m not sure what advantage there would be to doing so other than a dogged commitment to advancing noncognitivism.

What reservations might one have about the goal-oriented account? The first, discussed by Field, involves the worry that we are confusing epistemic evaluation with non-epistemic evaluation. In an early footnote (#3, 361), Field says he is not interested in “crassly pragmatic motivation for or against believing.” But one worries that in leaving open the range of goals that an agent might adopt in epistemically evaluating belief, he is guilty of conflating (crassly or not) pragmatic and epistemic evaluation. In the end, I think Field takes the distinction between epistemic and pragmatic evaluation to be a matter of relatively uninteresting semantic stipulation (385). Is he right?

In the first part of his paper, Field argues that a (computationally) ideal epistemic agent doesn’t select or revise fundamental epistemic principles on the basis of empirical evidence. One problem is that if the principle truly were fundamental, one would need to use the principle to test itself. He argues that because our fundamental principles can build in the capacity for self-correction, one can never be forced by counter-evidence to reject the principle. I’m not sure he is right about this. It seems to me, for example, that one can find oneself employing a principle that one treats as fundamental and that reveals itself as internally and irremediably unstable – the employment of memory to discover massive problems of misremembering might leave me in a position in which I must reach the conclusion that on the supposition that memory is reliable, it isn’t reliable. But this is a difficult question.

On the assumption that he is right about fundamental epistemic principles, Field suggests that the relevant epistemic question when it comes to “choosing” a principle (such as modus ponens) is “Why value a methodology that allows the use of modus ponens on no evidence?” (371). It seems to me, however, that there is an implicit “should” in the relevant question: Why should we value one fundamental epistemic principle over another? If one gives a pragmatic (goal-oriented) interpretation of this question, I think there may be a problem. I have argued elsewhere that what one pragmatically ought to do is not most naturally understood in terms of what will (perhaps through sheer luck) maximize satisfaction of one’s goals. Rather, the pragmatic “ought” should be understood in terms of what we are epistemically justified in believing concerning the achievement of goals or ends. But if such a view were correct, we’d be relying on fundamental epistemic concepts in our attempt to understand the epistemic/pragmatic evaluation of epistemic principles.

The above critical comments are obviously made by one who approaches many of the topics Field addresses from a quite different perspective. Anyone interested in deflationary accounts of meaning and truth and the way in which one can approach a host of problems from within such an approach will find this collection of essays invaluable. Field’s work has shaped importantly and lastingly the philosophical dialogue on these topics.