Truth: Its Nature, Criteria and Conditions

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Haig Khatchadourian, Truth: Its Nature, Criteria and Conditions, Ontos, 2011, 115pp., $79.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381269.

Reviewed by Joshua Rasmussen, Azusa Pacific University


"What is truth?" Pilate asked.[1] Haig Khatchadourian seeks to give an answer. One of his central convictions about the nature of truth is that it is unanalyzable and conceptually undefinable. But he does think we can give criteria of truth. His theory is that 'p is contingently true' if and only if (a) there are facts (at least one) that make p true, and (b) p is directly about (or refers to) the facts that make it true (79).[2] (Khatchadourian does not explicitly explain why he restricts his scope to contingent truths, but he appears to be motivated, at least in part, by a historical precedent to focus on contingent, "factual" truths (1).)

Khatchadourian also seeks to advance our understanding of the facts that make propositions true and of types of uses and conditions of the term 'true'. I will return to his theory of facts at the end of this review.

The bulk of the book is devoted to critiquing and interacting with alternative theories of truth. The theories he discusses are these: the correspondence theory, the identity theory, various subjectivist theories, and Rescher's quasi-coherentist theory. I will outline his central criticisms of these theories and draw attention to some potential replies that may generate further inquiry.

Khatchadourian begins by critiquing what he calls the traditional correspondence theory of truth. According to this theory, truth consists, by its very nature, in correspondence with reality or fact (1). Khatchadourian worries at the outset that no definition of 'true' can be given in terms whose meaning is more basic than the meaning of 'true' itself. He proposes, therefore, that the nature of truth is conceptually primitive and so cannot be analyzed in terms of anything, including correspondence.

Khatchadourian recognizes that even if 'true' is conceptually primitive, we might still be able to give necessary and sufficient conditions of a statement's being true. But he urges that then there will be no way to secure the actual existence of a correspondence relation (6). So, for example, if we suppose that p is true if and only if there are facts that make p true, it will not follow that there exists a making true relation, which we may call 'correspondence' (cf. 5). Or, again, if p is true if and only if p "correlates with" something, it doesn't follow that there exists an actual correlation relation appropriately called 'correspondence' (15). Traditional correspondence theorists are committed to the existence of a correspondence relation, however. Therefore, Khatchadourian resists the traditional correspondence theory.

There is also the familiar problem of how to define 'correspondence'. The expressions 'corresponds with' and 'agrees with' are vague metaphors, says Khatchadourian, and they tell us nothing about the relation between true propositions and the facts that make them true (5). This observation seems to reinforce his conviction that the concept of truth is more basic than the concept of "correspondence".

Khatchadourian does well to distinguish between the nature of truth and the conditions of truth. Building upon that distinction, I think correspondence theorists can carve a further distinction between the nature of truth and our concept of truth. It is open to correspondence theorists to suppose that we have a basic, unanalyzable concept of truth and that truth, by nature, is ultimately analyzable in terms of more basic ontological ingredients. With this distinction in hand, a correspondence theorist might define 'correspondence' in terms of 'true' as follows:

'x corresponds to y' =df '∃R((∀p(p is true) ↔ (∃f (p stands in R to f))) & x stands in R to y.)

A correspondence theorist could then suppose that our concept of correspondence is derivable from our concept of truth -- even if the nature of truth is itself ontologically analyzable in terms of a correspondence relation. Correspondence theorists who take this option could agree with Khatchadourian that truth is conceptually primitive, while still maintaining that a correspondence relation figures into the very nature of truth. They would also have a basis for denying that the meaning of 'corresponds to' is no clearer than a vague metaphor, for they would have a definition of 'corresponds to' in terms of a conceptually basic term, 'true'. This reply to Khatchadourian leaves open how to analyze the nature of correspondence.[3] So, perhaps correspondence theorists can actually embrace Khatchadourian's conviction that truth is conceptually primitive, even if it is metaphysically analyzable.

Khatchadourian goes on to tackle the identity theory, as represented by A. D. Woozley. The identity theory identifies true propositions with facts: p is true if and only if pis a fact. Khatchadourian's discussion contains a treasure of arguments that poke at the identity theory from various angles. Here is an outline of one of his central objections:

  1. If the identity theory is true, then 'p is true' expresses [or refers to] the same fact as 'p' (at least on Woozley's theory).
  2. 'p is true' does not express the same thing as 'p'.
  3. Therefore, the identity theory is not true.

On behalf of (1), Khatchadourian invites us to consider what fact the proposition expressed by 'p is true' might be. He says the only conceivable possibility is the fact expressed by 'p' (when 'p' is true). He calls this fact 'FP' and concludes that both 'p is true' and 'p' express, or mean, or refer to, FP (21).

You might wonder why 'p is true' couldn't express instead the very different fact that p is true. Khatchadourian answers that then the proposition expressed by 'p is true' would be identical to two different facts, FP and the fact that p is true, which is impossible (23). I confess that it is not perfectly clear to me why identity theorists must identify the proposition expressed by 'p is true' with FP. Why couldn't an identity theorist identify the proposition expressed by 'p is true' with just the one fact that p is true? Khatchadourian has an argument here that deserves scrutiny (21), but I'm not sure if it is meant to target every identity theory besides Woozley's.

I am more enthusiastic about Khatchadourian's defense of premise 2, that 'p is true' does not express the same thing as 'p'. He argues that the former is about p, whereas the latter is not: for example 'snow is white' is about snow, whereas 'snow is white is true' is about the statement that snow is white. Therefore, these statements do not express the same thing. Redundancy theorists will disagree, of course, but Khatchadourian presses anti-redundancy intuitions and considerations (27-28).

A key insight that seems to underlie much of Khatchadourian's critique of the identity theory is that facts are things that statements are about rather than things that statements express (or mean). Thus, 'the cat is on the mat' expresses something that could be false, but it is about something -- a fact involving a cat and a mat -- that could not in any sense be false. In support of this premise, Khatchadourian investigates how a false statement could possibly mean (or assert) anything, on Woozley's understanding, if there is no corresponding fact it expresses (33).

Khatchadourian moves next to subjectivist theories that analyze truth in terms of properties of persons. The theories examined include: truth as appraisal, an emotive theory, and Strawson's performative theory. (Rescher's "coherence" theory may be included here if it ultimately bottoms out in plausibility conditions, as Khatchadourian suggests.) An especially intriguing objection raised by Khatchadourian against the first two is that appraisal and emotions associated with true beliefs seem to come in varying degrees of intensity. Truth, by contrast, does not admit of degrees: statements are either fully true or not at all (64, 65).

A more pointed objection to all subjectivist theories is that there can be true statements, such as in mathematics, which are not yet known or affirmed by anyone. Khatchadourian supports this objection by observing that when we want to find out if a claim about the world is true we don't normally investigate the feelings or features of people. Rather, we examine things -- and facts? -- in the world that the claim is about (62). His arguments here should be viewed as foundations for further inquiry, as he narrows his focus to one major representative of each position.

I will now turn to Khatchadourian's theory of facts. His theory consists of roughly the following eight theses about facts.

  • First, true propositions are about facts: for example, the proposition that the cat is on the mat is about the fact that the cat is on the mat.
  • Second, facts are what make true propositions true: a proposition is true if and only if there is a fact that makes it so.
  • Third, facts can be created (in some sense) but not destroyed.
  • Fourth, facts lack spatial location.
  • Fifth, facts are about things in the world: the fact that the cat is on the mat is about a cat and a mat.
  • Sixth, "fact statements" are an event's, situation's, object's, or state of affair's being real/actual: for example, the fact that Obama is President is the reality of the state of affairs of Obama's being President.
  • Seventh, there are facts, but facts do not exist.
  • Eighth, 'p is a fact' does not mean the same as 'p is true'.

It would be interesting to know how Khatchadourian would answer certain other questions being discussed in the contemporary literature, such as: (a) How can there be negative facts (for example, the fact that there are no unicorns)? (b) How shall we analyze facts, including negative ones? (c) Is every true proposition made true by a fact, or only certain atomic ones? (d) What is the grounding relation between truth and fact?

The first question is especially relevant to Khatchadourian's purposes because he treats facts as things that propositions are about, and it is not just obvious how a "negative" proposition can be about a piece of reality that is "negative". Consider the proposition that there are no unicorns. If this proposition is about anything, it would seem to be about a lack of unicorns. But what piece of reality could be a lack of unicorns? Answering this question has proven far from easy: the usual candidate pieces of reality either aren't sufficient to explain the truth of the proposition in question,[4] or they are plausibly not what there are no unicorns is about.[5] It would be intriguing, therefore, to see how Khatchadourian weighs in on some of these other questions. I'm sure I would profit from his insights.

I will conclude with a couple observations about Khatchadourian's overall project. First, Khatchadourian works hard to advance our understanding of truth without being wedded to traditional theories of truth. Khatchadourian is clearly an original and creative thinker.

Second, prospective readers should be aware that Khatchadourian does not interact with the most contemporary conversations on truth. So, for example, there is no mention of such truth theorists as George Englebretsen, Andrew Newman, or Marian David. He restricts his attention mostly to theories and discussions that took place in the 1960s or earlier. He does, however, discuss Rescher's theory, which is more recent.

There are many ideas and insights in the book to profit anyone interested in truth. If you are a Pontius Pilate who would like to understand more about the nature and conditions of truth, or if you are a truth theorist looking for a new angle on old and enduring debates about truth, you'll find plenty of gems in this material.

[1] John 18: 38 (New International Version).

[2] Khatchadourian states his theory as a schema: it is contingently true that P if and only if there are facts that (a) 'P' is directly about and (b) make 'P' true. I believe my non-schematic formulation expresses the same basic idea.

[3] We could treat correspondence as ontologically primitive, or we could attempt to analyze it. For a defense of treating it as primitive, see Richard Fumerton, Realism and the Correspondence Theory of Truth. For a recent attempt at analysis, see my "How Truth Relates to Reality," American Philosophical Quarterly (forthcoming).

[4] For example, a state of all things not being a unicorn does not suffice to explain why there are no unicorns because that same state could exist if in addition to all the things in our world there were some unicorns.

[5] For a penetrating criticism of contemporary accounts of negative facts, see Trenton Merricks, Truth and Ontology.