Turning Images in Philosophy, Science, and Religion: A New Book of Nature

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Charles Taliaferro and Jil Evans (eds.), Turning Images in Philosophy, Science, and Religion: A New Book of Nature, Oxford University Press 2011, 256pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199563340.

Reviewed by Allen Stairs, University of Maryland


This volume is centered on two themes: naturalism and its discontents, and the role of images, broadly understood, in our thinking about nature. There is ample reference to "naturalism" and "physicalism" throughout the collection, but no extended attempt to say what those things might be. The editors, Taliaferro and Evans, note that on one reading "naturalism" says that only the natural sciences are reliable sources of knowledge; this notion often appears to be the one at issue. Whatever the ultimate merits of naturalism thus defined, it's easy to understand its attractions for a certain intellectual temperament: science aims to present hypotheses, arguments and evidence in a form precise enough to be evaluated rigorously; analytic philosophy has the same urge. For this reason, analytically-inclined readers may find themselves unsure how to judge many of the essays in the collection; a good deal of what's offered has an allusive rather than an argumentative cast, offering a picture for consideration rather than a thesis or hypothesis for assessment. This isn't so in every instance (E. J. Lowe's contribution is a particularly clear exception), nor is it a criticism, but it's a caveat to a certain kind of lector.

The first two essays are historical: Martin Kemp's introduction to D'Arcy Thompson ("'Loving Insight': D'Arcy Thompson's Aristotle and the Soul in Nature") and Geoffrey Gorham's "Early Scientific Images of God: Descartes, Hobbes, and Newton". Thompson was a 19th/20th-century polymath, holder of the Chair of Natural Philosophy at St. Andrews and author of On Growth and Form. He accepted evolution, but thought that accounting for morphology called for what we would call biophysics. Mathematics, on Thompson's view, is "embedded" in nature and ultimately gives us the means to "save the 'great vision' of the 'final cause' in nature." (p. 16) Whatever one makes overall of Thompson's outlook, Kemp gives us a delightful introduction to a subtle and penetrating sensibility.

Gorham's essay explores the relationship amongst ideas of God, space and time, and imagination in the thought of Descartes, Hobbes and Newton. Whereas Descartes' God was utterly incorporeal, this was not so for Hobbes (who held that God is "body"), nor for Newton, who famously claimed that space is God's sensorium. One particularly striking feature of the essay is the case Gorham develops that Newton wanted to strike a blow against the "disenchantment" of the world that many associate with the mechanical philosophy and Newton's own system.

How we see nature is a theme that recurs in several essays, especially in the selections by Douglas Hedley ("Homo Imaginans and the Concursus Divinus"), Mark Wynn ("Imaging Religious Thoughts in the Appearance of Sensory Things") and Jil Evans ("Re-Imaging the Galapagos"). All three deal with the way that imagination undergirds the way we make sense of the world. Hedley offers a historically rich account of the notion of imagination in a range of thinkers including Vico, Plato, Aristotle, Kant and others; Evans contrasts naturalistic and theistic images of the Galapagos, suggesting that a theistic imaging satisfies a desire for being at home in the world in a way that the naturalistic view cannot. The choice as she sees it is not a matter of "decisive argument" but rather "the object of desire and faith." (p. 246)

Wynn goes further. He takes his cue from Roger Scruton, who pointed out that we can, as it were, "see" the Cathedral of St. Denis as embodying a conception of the Heavenly City. Wynn stresses that the ideas make a phenomenological difference: the theologically informed conception of the building can be "inscribed in its appearance." (p. 208) This suggests that the capacity of theological ideas to inform the appearances can enter into a non-doxastic case for religious commitment -- i.e., for a species of religious commitment that doesn't amount to full-blown belief. But the fact that aspects of the world are hospitable to being seen under the aegis of certain religious ideas may be non-trivial -- something we couldn't have known a priori. Wynn thinks this can enter into an epistemic case for full-blown religious belief. Thus "The hypothesis that the world was made for some divinely ordained purpose will be confirmed to the extent that the thought of that purpose . . . is capable of entering unifyingly into the appearance of sensory things." (p. 220)

If we treat such facts as evidence, we can ask how strong the evidence is. The probability of this kind of unifying "seeing-as" may well be higher if the religious idea is true, but how much higher makes an evidential difference. To put it in a way that may jar in this context, if the likelihood ratio is low, the evidence is weak. Deciding how high it is would call for further analysis.

Gordon Graham's "The Sacred Beauty of Nature" raises a surprising issue: whether there is a viable secular/naturalist notion of the sacred. This may seem to be an odd question, but Graham points out: the sacred has a negative as well as a positive aspect, and the negative aspect goes with the idea that some actions are "abominations" -- are absolutely taboo. Graham offers cannibalism, incest, corruption of children and desecration of corpses as examples. He takes it for granted that even secularists want to treat all or most of these as absolutely forbidden, but he maintains that naturalists lack the resources to explain how this could be. If, for example, right and wrong are understood by way of utilitarian calculation, nothing turns out to be absolutely forbidden. The theist, however, can claim that certain ways of behaving are "unnatural," hence abominations, because they violate norms that God established when he endowed us with specific natures. (p. 195)

The secularist, or even a certain kind of theist, might reply this way: perhaps certain attitudes are always wrong; indifference to the suffering of innocents for example. However, saying that certain acts are absolutely wrong, regardless of circumstances and motive, is another thing. Enlarging on the matter of attitudes, what makes indifference to suffering wrong is not the fact that a God gave us a certain nature; it's something about what suffering is. If there's a God who endowed us with a natural revulsion for suffering, that's not what makes callousness wrong. Rather, any God worth the name would be at least as able as we are to see suffering for what it is, and might accordingly fashion us so that most of us, most of the time, are moved by that understanding.

Of course, this reply rejects moral nihilism. Whether the bare belief in objective value amounts to belief in a species of the sacred is hard to say, but Graham seems to have more in mind.

There's a good deal of worry about naturalism in the volume. Dale Jacquette ("Evolutionary Emergence of Intentionality and Imagination") is the most sanguine about naturalism's prospects. On intentionality, he maintains that any creature whose behavior is influenced by receptors/transducers -- even something as simple as a mollusk snapping its shell shut in response to a shadow -- provides an example of "intentionality in its most elementary manifestations." (p. 74)

Lowe ("Naturalism, Imagination, and the Scientific Worldview") doesn't share Jacquette's optimism about a naturalistic account of intentionality. According to Lowe, typical accounts confuse Shannon-style "information" with meaning. Meaning, however, calls for the ability to think with concepts, and Lowe writes that the transition to conceptual thinking "could not, in my view, have been a multi-staged process: a creature is either capable of thinking in concepts or it is not -- there is no halfway house." (p. 108) On the question of how evolution might bridge the gap between creatures with and without conceptual thinking, Lowe says "I simply do not know. It may even be that we are constitutionally incapable of answering a question like this: it might be a case of what has sometimes been called 'cognitive closure'." (p. 112) He continues:

we want to know how the emergence of conceptual thinking itself can be explained scientifically, that is in terms which unavoidably presuppose the very structure of conceptual thought whose origins are not in question. This looks suspiciously like trying to pull ourselves up by our own bootstraps . . . I strongly suspect that the question it raises does not make sense. (p. 113)

There's no room here to do the subject justice, but I don't feel the paradox that Lowe feels. After all, we can (indeed, must) wield concepts to talk about concepts, and we do so quite successfully. Why we would end up in nonsense if we tried to construct an account, using our concepts, of how conceptual thinking might have arisen isn't obvious.

Lowe's concerns are expressed modestly. Anthony O'Hear ("Darwinian Tensions") is bolder, and Conor Cunningham ("Naturalism Lost: Nature Regained") offers what might aptly be described as a jeremiad. O'Hear gives an argument of a now-familiar sort:

the theory of natural selection tells us that a creature's physical and mental development is conditioned by what will aid survival and reproduction -- and that is all. Why are we to suppose that speculating on our own nature has anything to do with that, or, even more, that the faculties we have developed to help us get around the savannah and find mates in earlier times are going to help us in coming to the truth in advanced scientific and philosophical investigations? (p. 57)

This characterization of evolution strikes me as a caricature, but a few broad-brush observations will have to do. Suppose, arguendo, that adaptation is the source of most biological change. We might expect most creatures that came about by that route to be no good at answering Big Questions about the world. But all that's needed to undermine O'Hear's worries are reasons to think adaptation could produce beings whose wisdom extends beyond the fabled four "F"s. Consider, then: certain sorts of reasoning abilities, not least the ability to reason hypothetically, would clearly be of use for surviving on the savannah. But even if reasoning first appeared because it helped keep us safe, fed and fecund, reasoning is a general-purpose tool; once it appears, there's nothing to keep it from being used in ever more subtle and esoteric ways, including testing hypotheses by exploring their consequences. Obviously there are many ways to extend the story, but once such reasoning gets launched, it might well lead us to find out things about the world that go beyond the most brutely useful.

Cunningham goes further than O'Hear. Naturalism on his view is "cognitive suicide" (p. 174), and if accepted in its starkest form -- eliminative materialism -- leaves us without any way to make sense, for example, of the idea that the Twin Towers tragedy occurred, because there won't really be such things as towers, let alone persons. (p. 182)

Cunningham's rhetoric is a tad warm, but his larger point is that if we adopt certain extreme forms of naturalism/physicalism/eliminativism, we pay a high price: giving up almost all of our ordinary beliefs. He also has a diagnosis of what drives some people to this sort of view: "Those that celebrate scientism and ontological (restrictive) naturalism do so because they have set out to achieve the banishment of the divine, no matter what the cost." (p. 159) Whether Cunningham is right is an empirical question, but my own experience suggests that there's more than a grain of truth here. However, one could also wonder: does anti-"naturalist" fervor reflect anxiety about threats to theism?

That may not be fair to Cunningham, some of whose barbs are well-aimed whatever one thinks of theism. One theme worth singling out is normativity. If there is a naturalism that denies the objectivity of all normative claims, it's a naturalism that really does seem to have committed cognitive suicide. The reason is simple: anyone, naturalist or not, who takes her own arguments seriously must think that the reasons in favor of her views are better than the arguments against. We can't take ourselves seriously if we don't grant a difference between better and worse reasons. No one can coherently take themselves to be making a case for the nullity of all norms, and any form of naturalism that denied all normative force would be begging to be ignored. Of course, from what we might call norms of rationality to other sorts of norms is not a short walk but there's still a lesson here: we're not under any obligation to give a naturalistic account of norms of rationality. From that, we might conclude something similar about moral norms: the fact that they raise a "queerness problem" from a certain point of view isn't enough to make a case against morality. Nihilistic naturalism is a bridge we needn't cross.

Where that leaves the issues which animate this collection, however, is another matter. Eliminativism about intentionality, for example, simply seems mad. From that it doesn't follow that there's no natural accounting for it. There are limits on naturalism that flow from the unavoidability of taking ourselves seriously in various ways -- as agents, as thinkers, and as needing to distinguish some kinds of better from worse. And as Daniel N. Robinson ("Aesthetics, Phantasia, and the Theistic") reminds us, Aristotle had an admirably broad notion of the natural. Applied to humans, "what is natural in human nature is what is coextensive with actual human lives, for example, rationality. Aristotle assumes that whatever is readily and (nearly) universally expressed by human beings in the absence of coercive and inhibiting forces is natural" (p. 135) That kind of open-ended good sense seems like an apt place to pause.