Understanding Counterfactuals, Understanding Causation: Issues in Philosophy and Psychology

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Christoph Hoerl, Teresa McCormack and Sarah Beck (eds.), Understanding Counterfactuals, Understanding Causation: Issues in Philosophy and Psychology, Oxford University Press, 2012, 272pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199695133.

Reviewed by Emma Tobin, University College London


One of the chief motivations for counterfactual theories of causation (Lewis 1973a) is the link between counterfactual claims and causal claims on the level of truth conditions. There is also a link between these two kinds of claims at the level of empirically informed causal judgements. In other words, people find it helpful to engage in counterfactual thinking when considering complex causal scenarios. Given these links, it might seem obvious to expect that psychological studies of counterfactual thought would be helpful in thinking about philosophical accounts of the nature of causal reasoning. Oddly, the psychological literature on the subject has been largely ignored or at least underutilised by philosophers working on the subject. This volume is a united effort by philosophers and psychologists to address this interdisciplinary neglect. It is an excellent addition to the field and brings an evidence-based approach to bear on some of the conceptual issues and to the philosophical views on causation and counterfactual thought.

In particular, the volume addresses the counterfactual process view of causal reasoning, according to which engaging in counterfactual thought is an essential part of the process involved in making causal judgements. (See McCormack, Frosch and Burns, Ch. 2). A simple statement of the counterfactual process view of causal reasoning is as follows:

In order to arrive at a causal judgement like "A causes B" the reasoner must engage in the following counterfactual conditional: "if A did not occur, B would not occur".

Given the intuitive and intimate link between counterfactual and causal judgments we might expect that empirical studies of this connection would provide supporting evidence for the process view of causal reasoning. Indeed, initial empirical studies claimed to provide such evidence: an influential paper by Harris, German and Mills (1996), demonstrated that children as young as 3 years old, can consider counterfactual scenarios in trying to figure out both what has caused a particular outcome and how it might have been prevented. This empirical study might be presented as evidence for the counterfactual process view of thought.

This volume presents some alternative empirical studies, which reveal that the link is more problematic and complex than was initially conceived. Pace Harris, German and Mills (1996), McCormack, Frosch and Burns (Ch. 2), Perner and Rafetseder (Ch. 4) and Beck et al (Ch. 5) all come to a different conclusion. They claim in the final analysis that counterfactual thought is a very sophisticated cognitive achievement, which may not fully develop until the age of 10 or 12 years. In relation to the (1996) study, they claim that when children appear to answer correctly to subjunctive conditionals, they are merely entertaining indicative conditionals. In other words, children entertain 'If x doesn't happen, y happens' rather than 'If x had not happened, y would have happened'. In contrast, Sobel (Ch. 6) claims that a domain-general ability to engage in counterfactual reasoning in children is masked by children's lack of background knowledge within a specific domain that they could bring to light in the evaluations of counterfactuals about that domain. Thus, the apparent poor performance in counterfactual judgements only reveals a paucity of domain-specific background knowledge.

In Chapter 2, McCormack et al. examine the relationship between causal and counterfactual judgements in five to seven year old children. In both verbal and non-verbal tasks, children seem to demonstrate an understanding of causal relations long before they appear to be fully competent with counterfactual reasoning. Children reliably judge a common cause structure or a causal chain structure given appropriate temporal cues. Moreover, children can reliably distinguish these two kinds of causal structure. Nevertheless, when asked questions about potential interventions in the systems, children do not provide answers that are consistent with their choice of causal structure. Thus, their performance in counterfactual reasoning is poor, despite the reliability of their causal judgements.

In Chapter 7, Mandel looks at judgements regarding a sequence of events with a negative outcome, asking adults to generate suitable counterfactual statements that would have prevented the negative outcome. Oddly, adults focus on antecedents that are different to those that would be judged as "causes" of the negative outcome. These empirical studies would suggest that for both children and adults the link between causal judgements and counterfactual reasoning is not as straightforward as was originally indicated in Harris, German and Mills (1996).

One conceptual point about these empirical studies is that they rely on the idea that a counterfactual process view of thought is committed to people being able to articulate the relevant counterfactuals that underlie their causal judgements. Why is this the case? It seems altogether possible that this kind of counterfactual processing occurs in neurophysiological mechanisms that enact these kinds of reasoning skills in human beings, and thus are entirely sub-conscious. Therefore, the ability to engage in counterfactual reasoning might not be explicit and to bring it to bear in conscious reasoning may just be cognitively arduous. The commitments of a counterfactual process view of thought and different possibilities for spelling it out were not made explicit enough in the volume, in my opinion.

There are also conceptual objections to the counterfactual process view of thought. Edgington (Ch. 11) takes the standard circularity objection to the Lewisean counterfactual view of causation which claims that the truth of the relevant counterfactual depends on certain causal claims. She claims that this objection to Lewis' theory can be extended to a psychological counterpart of the theory like the counterfactual process view of counterfactual reasoning outlined above, or indeed to any account, which tries to base our understanding of causal claims on prior and independent counterfactual reasoning abilities.

Woodward address how his (2003) interventionist account of causal judgments can deal with the kind of circularity objection raised by Edgington above. In his contribution to this volume (Ch. 1), Woodward argues that the interventionist account is not viciously circular. We can specify the causal criteria an event must meet in order to count as an intervention that may settle whether 'A causes B' is true without touching on the particular causal relation, if any, that obtains between A and B itself.

Nevertheless, the circularity objection does force the defender of the theory to make more precise how exactly we should think of the role of causal reasoning in counterfactual thought. Johannes Roessler contrasts two ways in which we might think of this relationship in Chapter 3.

Another conceptual problem that is discussed in the volume is the relationship between causal selection and more general causal understanding. Hitchcock (Ch. 8) discusses a range of empirical studies, which aim to show that causal selection can be influenced not just by empirical norms, but also social legal and even moral norms. Menzies (Ch. 9) offers an interesting unified account of the truth conditions of causal claims that effectively builds the normative criteria governing causal selection into those truth conditions. Woodward (Ch. 1) on the other hand, says that causal selection may turn out to be irreducibly subjective. For this reason, he claims that we need two separate projects: the first providing an account of causal selection and the second accounting for the principles according to which we distinguish between causation and mere correlation.

Another conceptual issue that is addressed is the difference between counterfactual conditionals whose antecedents are false and future hypotheticals (Perner and Rafsteder  Ch. 4, Woodward Ch. 1 and Feeney and Handley Ch. 12). The discussion of this conceptual issue in the volume is very interesting material and may provide a new way forward for counterfactual views of causation in philosophy more generally. Mandel (Ch. 7) discusses why much of the psychological literature has focused on the relationship between counterfactuals and causal thinking by considering events where the outcomes are known. In contrast, Woodward and Feeney and Handley suggest that we should include future hypotheticals in our account of causal judgments. Indeed, for Feeney and Handley, looking at how we evaluate future hypotheticals in general is the key to understanding our causal judgments.

In Chapter 12, Feeney and Handley suggest that the suppositional theory of conditionals (Evans, Over & Handley, 2005) can help us to understand the psychological processes involved in making causal judgments. According to this theory, understanding conditionals requires us to engage in mental simulations, where the subject postulates a world where the antecedent were true and assesses the probability of the conditional holding in such a scenario. Evaluating explicit causal claims involves the evaluation of conditional constructions used to deny such claims. This is a process of simulation that involves imagining that the antecedent event is "undone". However, it would have been helpful to see more explicit discussion of the differences between this suppositional approach to conditionals and the alternative truth conditional theories, such as truth functional and possible worlds semantics.

In Chapter 11 Byrne, who focuses the discussion on exceptional or unexpected outcomes, provides another interesting context for the link between counterfactuals and causal judgements. In the case of an exceptional outcome (e.g., a car accident), people construct causal explanations and competing counterfactual scenarios. This is because an unexpected outcome indicates a violation of their understanding of the usual causal relationships. So, they tend to focus on exceptional antecedents to explain the exceptional outcome. Byrne reveals the complexity of the relationship between causal and counterfactual thought by showing four dimensions to studying the relationship: (1) how do counterfactual 'if only' thoughts affect causal thoughts? (2) how do causal thoughts affect counterfactual thoughts? (3) how do causal and counterfactual thoughts differ, and (4) how do semi-factual 'even if' thoughts affect causal thoughts?

The distinctions between these four questions are helpful and help to illuminate the complexity that any analysis faces. Byrne claims that these questions can only be answered in the light of two considerations. The first is that each counterfactual thought requires people to construct a mental representation of two possibilities, the counterfactual conjecture and the presupposed factual reality. Counterfactual thoughts make explicit what would otherwise remain implicit. This is an interesting suggestion since it provides a role for simulation/representation in making counterfactual reasoning explicit. The second consideration is that there are different sorts of causes. In this case, a clear reason is provided for why we might expect children would lack counterfactual reasoning; namely because it is a sophisticated cognitive achievement, which would support the claim that it does not fully develop until the age of ten or twelve years.

This is certainly an interesting volume and makes a major contribution to counterfactual accounts of causation. The analysis of empirical studies in the psychological literature provides an evidence-based approach for philosophers who are interested in counterfactual accounts of causation. Moreover, the conceptual problems are illuminated by these empirical studies and suggest more nuanced conceptual questions about the role of counterfactual reasoning in causal thought. This interdisciplinary volume is a must read for advanced students of causation in both philosophy and psychology as well as most obviously for academics in both fields.



Lewis, D. (1973): Counterfactuals. Oxford: Blackwell.

Evans, J.St.B.T. Over, D.E., & Handley, S.J., (2005): 'Suppositions,extensionality and conditionals: a critique of the model theory of Johnson-Laird and Byrne (2002)', Psychological Review 112: 1040-52.

Harris, P.L. German T. and Mills, P. (1996), 'Childrens's Use of Counterfactual Thinking in Causal Reasoning', Cognition 61: 233-59.