Understanding Love: Philosophy, Film, and Fiction

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Susan Wolf and Christopher Grau (eds.), Understanding Love: Philosophy, Film, and Fiction, Oxford University Press, 2014, 397pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195384505.

Reviewed by Alessandro Bertinetto, University of Udine


Artworks can offer insights through which we can understand ourselves, our thoughts and emotions, and our relations with other people, as well as our place in nature and in the social world, by means of illustrating or exemplifying perspectives on us and on our world. Through the perspectives offered by art -- which can be judged right or wrong -- we may enhance our understanding of ourselves and of our world (see James O. Young, Art and Knowledge, Routledge, 2001). Moreover, they may also inspire new or enrich existing philosophical reflection about some topic. Some art forms, especially narrative ones such as literature and film, seem particularly suited to this purpose.

This book takes seriously the idea that art can help us understand aspects of life and the world in a non-trivial, sometimes actually profound, way. Its seventeen essays are dedicated to the exploration of different perspectives that literature and cinema present on various kinds of love -- for example, love for animals, sexual or erotic love, romantic love, familiar love, interracial love, homosexual love, love for objects -- and the possible different relations between those kinds of love as well as with other feelings. The essays are claimed to be either interdisciplinary or non-disciplinary "exercises in thinking and writing that, while inevitably reflecting the author's training and temperament, engage with a text or explore an idea in a way unconstrained by disciplinary boundaries" (p. 6). Correspondingly, the book is not driven, at least not openly, by a single encompassing philosophical or thematic view. The  editors arranged the essays alphabetically by author's name because there is no special order in which they should be read.

The articles can indeed profitably be read separately, as each can be taken as outlining a philosophical strategy for understanding a particular movie or novel with reference to the question of love. Here are some examples. "The Untold Want of Now, Voyager" by Maria DiBattista offers a close reading that illuminates Irving Rapper's 1942 cinematic melodrama, while Douglas MacLean's "Between Desire and Destruction: A Reading of The Go-Between" is an interpretation of Joseph Losey's 1971 movie about "the failure of love and the destructive power of sexual desire" (p. 164). If you want to grasp the point of the Coen brothers' movie The Man Who Wasn't There, you will certainly profit from reading George Wilson's "Love and Bullshit in Santa Rosa: Pastiche in The Man Who Wasn't There". If you are instead about to read Ian McEwan's novel Saturday, you'd be well-advised to spend some time with Frances Ferguson's "Communicating Love: Ian McEwan, Saturday, and Personal Affection in the Information Age". Moreover, if you are in doubt about the general meaning of Hitchcock's Shadow of a Doubt, you would do well to turn to Gilberto Perez's "Hitchcock's Family Romance: Allegory in Shadow of a Doubt".

Each essay assigns proper philosophical reflection a different place and weight in order to offer a hermeneutical perspective on the novel or film on which it focuses. However, all endorse the idea, explicitly stated by Frederick Neuhouser (p. 230), that novels and movies address us, our imperfect world, and precisely for this reason are philosophically intriguing. After all, as Toril Moi observes, "philosophy can be found anywhere ordinary human beings act in ordinary ways" (p. 191). Some of the essays directly invoke elaborate philosophical arguments or theories in order to explain the way in which a film or a novel approaches the issue of love. But many other essays are rather excellent exercises of literary or cinematographic criticism, which, while focusing on the way in which a movie or a novel addresses the issue of love, do not do so in an explicitly philosophical way.  That is the case, for instance,  with Nick Halpern's psychological-sociological discussion of the "embarrassing fathers" of famous writers like Yeats and Henry James, with Judith Smith's political-sociological analysis of the ordinary love stories presented in postwar American films ("Talking Back to Hollywood: Ordinary Love Stories on Film, 1946-1964"), and with Lawrence Blum's moral-political criticism of the "False Racial Symmetries in Far From Heaven and Elsewhere". (Those are, by the way, films that endorse the false view that "a particular type of immoral problematic behavior is assumed to carry the same moral significance when its target is whites as when it is blacks; or when a race-neutral principle is applied as if there were no significant difference between white and black, when there is" (p. 37).)

In any case, despite the diversity of topics and perspectives offered in the essays, there is a common thread that implicitly binds many if not all of the contributions. It is the relationship between love and knowledge, which is not at all strange, considering that the book is about the philosophical potential of fiction and that philosophy does, after all, deal centrally with knowledge. This relationship can be specified as the possible gain that love can offer in terms of knowledge and vice versa as the idea that true love requires a solid ("objective") knowledge of reality, and cannot be based only on subjective projections guided by private idiosyncratic visions, wishes, or fears, although those elements are often important in love relations.

Rae Langton addresses this issue directly, drawing upon Hume's theory of projection. According to Hume, a human being's relation to the world and to other persons is governed overridingly by three mechanisms, phenomenological gilding, wishful thinking, and pseudo-empathy. As a result, beliefs are generated through which the world is colored by sentiment, our knowledge is influenced by desire, and our minds tend to harmonize with the minds of others. As William James observed, projection plays an important role in love, by projecting "an image of the other that is rosier than the reality" (p. 148). However, projection may also be involved in sexual love, running the risk of objectifying the loved person as "an object of appetite," as Kant said. Both good and bad aspects of projection in love are well illustrated in Ian McEwan's love story and spy thriller The Innocent (1990), which is set in Berlin in 1956 at the beginning of the Cold War. John Schlesinger transposed the book to film in 1995, but according to Langton, while the novel succeeds in showing the duality of projection -- as both a source of joy and a present danger -- in the love affair between the young English technician Leonard Markham and the older German girl Maria, the movie still fails to capture the complex phenomenology of projection.

The complexity of this phenomenology is the focus of Toril Moi's "'Something That Might Resemble a Kind of Love': Fantasy and Realism in Henrik Ibsen's Little Eyolf" and of Susan Wolf's "Loving Attention: Lessons in Love From The Philadelphia Story," both drawing on Iris Murdoch's moral philosophy. Moi observes that Ibsen's play exemplifies the "intrinsic connection between realism -- the attempt to see others as they are -- and love" (p. 193) and that "The fundamental oppositions between fantasy and reality, and between selfishness and love" organize the thematic structure of the text. Wolf, for her part, discusses "The ideas of loving attention and of the (loving) knowledge such attention yields" (p. 370). Loving attention -- "[the] attention that portrays its object as good" (p. 371) -- is accurate and positive (and for this reason it differs from a careful, but more neutral, attention). This amounts to saying that "love is not blind, but blinkered. To attend to someone lovingly is to accentuate the positive, not necessarily to fabricate it" (p. 372). However, this does not mean that acknowledgement of the flaws of the beloved always results in an attenuation of love. George Cukor's romantic comedy The Philadelphia Story (1940) illustrates the point very well. Dexter (Cary Grant) loves Tracy (Katharine Hepburn) despite her flaw of demanding perfection in other people. The film illustrates that "A love is not better for casting its object in a purely positive light. The best love is an attentive love, that sees its object as it really is, and can love completely and unreservedly even in light of that knowledge" (p. 375). So, "The denial of the positive light ideal of love is a veritable theme of the movie" (p. 375). In other words, true love is not nonjudgmental. The movie rejects perfection as an adequate standard for love, not judgment. The compatibility between the epistemic correctness of love and the benevolence towards the beloved is granted by the selfless character of loving attention, as a kind of "attention that is not geared to or distorted by self-interest" (p. 380). "The best kind of love . . . tries to see its object clearly," but "does not require universal love" (p. 381-2). To sum up: the philosophical lesson of The Philadelphia Story is that the authentic object of love is reality itself, and a consequence of this is that one need not love cruel persons.

Nor even animals, as defended by Werner Herzog's documental film Grizzly Man, according to the interpretation of Macalester Bell. Bell's "Grizzly Man, Sentimentality, and Our Relationships with Other Animals," discusses the argument developed by the German director in his documentary movie about the dramatic, and perhaps tragic, story of Timothy Treadwell. After living unarmed for thirteen summers with Alaskan grizzly bears, he and his girlfriend were devoured by a bear. Treadwell thought that men and wild animals can be friends and that this friendship is valuable. Love for animals, John Berger says, can indeed offer an escape for the loneliness of man as species. However, Herzog shows in his film that "Treadwell's interactions with the bears were irredeemably marred by sentimentality" (p. 19). According to Bell, Herzog worries that Treadwell's sentimentality is motivated by his "skepticism about the possibility of knowing another animal" (p. 20), and if we cannot know something, we cannot love it: "loving attention involves genuine knowledge of the other, while sentimental affection involves feeling of affection in the absence of genuine knowledge of the other" (p. 22). Herzog's point is exactly that love for wild animals is inappropriate, because it is merely sentimental and unrealistic. Different from loving attention, sentimental emotions misrepresent reality in some way, because they are self-congratulatory, self-indulgent and simplistic: they project qualities of innocence onto their target, and falsify it. However, Bell observes that Herzog, who strangely ends his movie in a sentimental manner, is wrong in maintaining that it is simply impossible to know animals and love them in the right way. After all, we do know animals to a certain extent, and Treadwell too knew the bears, at least to some extent.

Not only that. Against Wolf's thesis on "loving attention," Bell claims that

Sentimental affection is valuable when it is a perspective we occasionally take up and is balanced by loving attention [otherwise it would be simply unrealistic]. A loving relationship completely devoid of sentimental affection may fail to provide the reassurance that loving relationships often require. (p. 34)

Because, "The simplification characteristic of sentimental affection allows us to attend to the other without being overcome by the anxiety that can accompany careful attention" (p. 35). This is due to sentimental emotions being more easily communicable than loving attention, which is idiosyncratic. Hence Bell concludes that it is not Treadwell's sentimentality that is objectionable, but the harm caused by considering bears as symbols of innocent virtue, which they are not. Therefore at the end Bell agrees with "Herzog's apparent ambivalence toward sentimentality" (p. 35). For "we have reasons to be critical of those who always respond to the world in a sentimental way. But the criticisms of sentimentality should not lead us to be critical of all sentimental responses. Sometimes, responding sentimentally is what is called for by love itself" (pp. 35-36). Yet Bell's point about sentimentality and loving attention -- the key to her argument -- is somehow unclear. Why is loving attention idiosyncratic? And in what sense is the easy communicability of sentimentality valuable? Moreover, Herzog's attitude towards sentimentality seems to be coherently critical to me, and fits pretty well his whole filmography. Still, Bell's essay is one of the philosophically more successful articles in the book.

Equally rich and intriguing is Christopher Grau's discussion of Steven Soderbergh's Solaris (2002), a remake of Andrei Tarkovsky's 1972 film, which is in turn an adaptation of Stanisław Lem's 1961 science fiction novel. The complex story narrated raises important questions about love and personal identity, which Grau examines with the help of Derek Parfit's philosophy. Viewers face a "vivid thought experiment": "If confronted with a near duplicate of someone you have loved and lost, what would your response be? What should your response be?" (p. 106). The force of the experiment relies on the tension that can exist in real life between loving a person and loving his/her qualities. The philosophical core of the film is the question, discussed for example by Robert Nozick, as to whether we love the person or the qualities that are manifested by the person and that could be maybe found in someone else. The question seems strange, because usually we cannot distinguish between the person and his/her qualities, since the particular bundle of qualities presented by person A could hardly be found in persons B, C, etc. However, if one is simply attached to physical qualities, for instance, he/she can indeed find someone else possessing them. Moreover, as DiBattista's essay on Now, Voyager also shows, it makes sense to ask whether the beloved and the sensations and experiences offered by love really are unique and irreplaceable. Solaris makes us reflect precisely on the focus of our loving attachment, while taking an ambiguous stance on the issue. On the one hand, it seems to defend a Parfitian answer to the problem, according to which personal identity is unimportant: qualities, not persons, matter. On the other hand, it does not give up the language of identity: knowing who is the person we are attached to still seems to be a condition for authentic love.

A reflection about the importance of knowing reality for achieving good love relationships is also offered by David Paletz. His article seems to deal with a documentary: Ross McElwee's Sherman's March. A Meditation on the Possibility of Romantic Love in the South During an Era of Nuclear Weapons Proliferation (1986). I said "seems" because the main question at issue is precisely whether "love is made for fiction" or can be also the topic of a documentary, which aims at depicting reality. This seems to be difficult precisely because "documentarians deal in reality," which makes documentary an odd place to explore "the idealistic belief that romance is possible" (p. 233). However, suggests Paletz, "the film is indeed about a quest, no matter how improbable, for romantic love" (p. 237). The improbability of this quest is the most interesting point of Paletz's discussion. He notices a tension between the intimacy sought by the protagonist and director with the women who are the potential target of his romantic love, on the one hand, and, on the other hand, the intrusiveness of the camera. At the end the possibly narcissistic love for the camera prevails over the romantic and sentimental love for the filmed women, which turns out to be the result of the projection (the word is here very appropriate!) of the camera "eye" (or "I"). The conclusion seems inescapable that the movie fails either as a true documentary or as a film about romantic love. It cannot succeed as both. (Obviously, it can fail as both, and after having watched the movie, that is my personal critical verdict on it). After all, as Ferguson's article on Ian McEwan maintains, one of the features of love seems to be the "paradox of incommunicability -- the lovers' inability to explain their love to observers and the documented inability of non-lovers to understand" (p. 86). McElwee's camera is ultimately just an observer, and the confusion between participation and observation is likely the reason why his project fails.

There are reflections about the connection between love and knowledge in some of the other essays. Gilberto Perez's essay on Hitchcock's Shadow of a Doubt is an allegorical reconstruction of the film as a cinematic reflection about the dangers of knowledge, which often is knowledge of evil. C.D.C. Reeve's "Lessons in Looking" is an interpretation of Krzysztof Kieślowski's A Short Film About Love which ,while drawing attention to the voyeuristic inclinations of love, makes us reflect on the ambiguity of the link between love and knowledge: on the one hand, looking, as expression of sexual desire masked as will to know, "can . . . feed the obsessive circle of fantasy," while distorting reality; on the other hand, "when done with love, it can lead to seeing and understanding" (p. 285). An analogous conflicting relation holds between the "limitless communication ideal," which is "the strongest positive attribute of omniscient narration," and its "dark corollary": "limitless manipulation," i.e., "the compulsive stage managing of others' lives for one's own prurient delectation, an exercise of a not-so-secret will to power" (p. 324). George Toles' "Dipping Into Omniscience With Willa Cather: Authorial Knowledge as Love" deals with this topic. Focusing on the relation between a narrator and her characters, Toles observes that the ideal of "limitless communication," while aiming at overcoming the problem of solitude, risks being excessive and manipulative.

Finally, there is a sense in which Rousseau's novel Julie also offers a view of the connection between love and (self-)knowledge. Frederick Neuhouser, in his excellent "Rousseau's Julie: Passion, Love, and the Price of Virtue," observes that the problem at the core of Rousseau's novel is certainly the conflict between virtue, love, and sexual desire. However, an important role in the existential attempt to solve this conflict is the epistemic self-transparency gained by Julie at the end of the novel, and of her life, when she understands that sexual love is egoistic, while love is attentive toward the beloved's true good. Leaving aside the moralistic implications of Julie's ending, the point seems to be again that a robust knowledge of reality is important for healthy love experiences. Still, it remains true that love -- or at least some kinds of love -- is not healthy, but is often a disease, or like a disease, as plenty of novels and movies do not cease to remind us. A merit -- and maybe the main merit -- of this book is to focus intelligently on this apparent paradox, which is often explored, in different ways, by both good and bad novels and films.