Understanding Moral Obligation: Kant, Hegel, Kierkegaard

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Robert Stern, Understanding Moral Obligation: Kant, Hegel, Kierkegaard, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 277pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107012073.

Reviewed by C. Stephen Evans, Baylor University


This book is a valuable contribution both to our understanding of late modern philosophy and to the contemporary debate about the status of moral obligations. Stern shows how valuable historical understanding can be to a contemporary problem (in this case in metaethics), and at the same time shows how the evaluation of philosophical positions and arguments provides an essential help in interpreting the history of philosophy, in this case the history of ethics among German and German-influenced thinkers of the nineteenth and late eighteenth centuries.

Stern begins by challenging what he calls the standard story of Kant's place in the history of ethics, which sees Kant as a constructivist who develops this position to avoid the damage to moral autonomy that is supposed to follow inexorably from value realism. He gives convincing philosophical arguments that value realism per se does not threaten moral autonomy, and also powerful textual arguments that Kant was in fact a value realist. The threat to autonomy does not stem from value realism, but from moral obligation. On Stern's view, Kant develops his "self-legislation" account of moral obligation as an alternative to a traditional divine command account of such obligation, since rooting moral obligation in God would undermine moral autonomy. In this context Stern considers and argues against John Hare's claim that Kant actually accepts a divine command view of moral obligations. On Hare's view it is only a particular type of divine command view that threatens autonomy, and Kant himself accepts a divine command view that is consistent with autonomy. Stern's historical story requires him to reject Hare's position; I will say more about this below.

On Stern's exposition, Kant's ethic is similar to the "hybrid" views of some earlier medieval and modern philosophers, who accepted an objectivist account of value but still gave God's commands an important role in ethics. God's commands are not arbitrary, but directed at the good, but the good alone does not ground the obligatory. Kant's view is a similar hybrid theory, but Kant, in the interests of preserving autonomy, sees the source of the commands as within the moral agent herself rather than in God.

After giving a lucid exposition of the Kantian account of moral obligations, Stern turns to two other important nineteenth century figures, Hegel and Kierkegaard, who provide a challenge to Kant's view. Hegel, influenced deeply by some critical remarks about Kant by Schiller, finds Kant's position to be both "dualistic," and also demeaning and degrading to humans. It is dualistic in that Kant leaves us with an irresolvable conflict between human rational wills and human inclinations, and it is demeaning in that the view seems to deny the possibility of a spontaneous and graceful embrace of the right, with no sense of struggle or necessitation. Hegel does not want to return to the divine command view Kant has left, but rather wants to see the source of moral obligations in the social expectations of a rational state, one with which the individual can fully identify without alienation.

Hegel's view, in turn, is subjected to criticism by Kierkegaard, whom Stern interprets as returning to the divine command account of moral obligation from which Kant had departed. The three positions thus form a "dialectical circle" that returns to where it began. On Stern's view, and here I think he is entirely right, Kierkegaard accuses Hegel's view of leading to a complacent "reduction of the moral demand" (to use John Hare's phrase). Hegel's attempt to ground moral obligation in society cannot account for the radical demands of true morality, which requires us not merely to accept "my station and its duties" (to use Bradley's memorable phrase), but to love all human persons, including our enemies. Only God's authority can be the basis for such a moral demand, and for Kierkegaard it cannot be undermined by the "ought implies can" principle because God can provide the supernatural grace and assistance to live in accordance with such obligations.

Such a brief summary cannot really do justice to the richness of Stern's discussion, which contains very clear and insightful discussions of a large number of important primary texts. Furthermore, Stern is invariably fair and judicious in his judgments. I found his discussions of Kierkegaard to be particularly insightful and generous. Considering that Stern is best known as a Hegel scholar, this is a real tribute to his fair-mindedness and desire for historical accuracy. Stern recognizes that the criticisms the various views make of each other are far from decisive. There are replies the Kantian can make to the Hegelian and replies the Hegelian can make to the Kierkegaardian. Nevertheless, Stern feels the force of the critical arguments made by each position and tries hard to get his readers to feel this force as well.

Although I admire this book greatly and found it to be informative and wise in most respects, I did find myself disagreeing with a number of points, two of which I will discuss in conclusion. First, I was not completely convinced by Stern's reply to Hare's argument that Kant is, in the end, a type of divine command theorist about moral obligations. Stern is well aware of the fact that Kant does in many places affirm quite unambiguously that moral obligations are divine commands, and that it is rational so to regard them. He also knows that Kant ascribes an important role to God as the "head" of the Kingdom of Ends to which rational moral agents belong as subjects. Hare appeals to all of these textual points and more. Here all Stern has to say is that it is "not possible just to take these comments [of Kant] at face value" (p. 59). Why not?

The reason Stern offers is that Kant rejects the idea of treating "religion as prior to morality." However, the idea that religion is "prior to morality" is vague, and there may well be several senses in which morality is "prior to religion" that are compatible with a type of divine command theory. For example, anyone who accepts an ontological view of moral obligations as divine commands, and also wants to put forward a moral argument for belief in God, might well hold that morality must be epistemically prior to religion. It might be possible for Kant to reconcile his view of moral obligations as self-legislated with a divine command view if one has the right understanding of the nature of the Kingdom of Ends, and the respective roles played by the Head and the subjects of that kingdom. God's commands are ones that he necessarily issues as a rational being, but those commands must still be reflectively endorsed by the subjects of the kingdom. Once Stern has given up the claim that there is a tension between moral autonomy and objectivity about moral norms, it may be possible to reconcile a divine command view with a self-legislation view.

This problem is exacerbated by another serious problem with Stern's view. Stern argues that the "necessitation" of moral duty for Kant is explained by the contrast Kant draws between a "holy will," which necessarily wills in accordance with moral principles, and human wills, which always retain the possibility of a conflict between duty and desire (pp. 75-88). Kant does not need God for moral obligation but only the conceptual contrast between a being like God and beings who are like us. However, this cannot work as an explanation of the authority of moral obligations. What Stern is explaining is why that authority is experienced by humans as burdensome or constraining, but what is needed is an explanation of why moral principles have authority in the first place.

Compare the situation with a legal obligation. Suppose the state passes a law that I must drive no more than 55 mph on the highway. Since I like to drive my convertible faster than this, I find the law burdensome and constraining. My desires explain why I experience the law in this way, but not why I am obligated to obey the law. For that we need an account of my relation to the state and why it has authority for me. Surely something similar is true of moral obligations. This can also be seen from the fact that Kierkegaard accepts the same view of morality as constraint as Kant does. He agrees with Kant that we do not (at least those of us who are not apostles or perfected saints) have holy wills, but Kierkegaard insists on the need for divine authority as the basis for the obligation. The fact that I find the obligation burdensome is hardly an explanation for the authority of the obligation.

The "dialectical circle" that Stern constructs among the three philosophers requires that one recognize a balance between the arguments and insights underlying each view. Inevitably some philosophers will find this balance lacking. Surely many contemporary secular philosophers who are non-theists will find Kierkegaard's divine command view to be a non-starter and not a serious competitor. However, some Christian thinkers (and perhaps some others) will find the points that are alleged to support the Hegelian view to be similarly weak. Suppose one thinks that the conflict that Kant and Kierkegaard both see between the human will and human desires is simply a fact. That some may find this fact "degrading" or "demeaning" does not make it any less a fact. Stern says that the Hegelian here may object that the Kantian and Kierkegaardian views are too influenced by the Christian doctrine of the fall that sees humans as sinful (p. 250). However, if humans are sinful this is hardly a valid objection, and describing a view as Christian does not count as a criticism unless Christianity is known to be false.

Moreover, it is not obvious that one must be a Christian believer to find the Christian view of human sinfulness plausible. Perhaps one only has to read the newspapers or listen to the news on television. Chesterton says somewhere that the doctrine of original sin is the only Christian doctrine that can be empirically confirmed. For some of us the fact that some find the doctrine insulting may only be a further confirmation of the truth of the doctrine. Traditionally, original sin is regarded as rooted primarily in pride, but it is surely plausible to interpret a response of offense to the claim that humans are sinful as motivated by pride. Rather than denying the reality of sin, one might think a more profound solution is to seek to better our condition.