Understanding Vagueness: Logical, Philosophical and Linguistic Perspectives

Placeholder book cover

Petr Cintula, Christian G. Fermüller, Lluís Godo, and Petr Hájek (eds.), Understanding Vagueness: Logical, Philosophical and Linguistic Perspectives, College Publications, 2011, 421pp., $24.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781848900370.

Reviewed by C.M. Asmus, Japan Institute of Science and Technology


The title of this book suggests that the collection will provide an understanding of vagueness; the subtitle promises an interdisciplinary approach. By reading the book, we should thus come to understand vagueness from at least three perspectives. The preface tells us that the collaborative research project Logical Models of Reasoning with Vague Information (LoMoReVI) was prompted by two insights:

Contemporary formal logic, in particular, mathematical fuzzy logic, provides a rich toolbox for designing and assembling models of reasoning with vague predicates and propositions.

Fuzzy logic alone is not sufficient for modeling vagueness at a level that matches the many subtle aspects of vague language use that have emerged from philosophical and linguistic research on this topic. (p. v)

The connection between the book and LoMoReVI is that most of the contributions were presentations at a conference run by the research project. We should thus expect a focus on logical models of reasoning with vague information. The editors highlight two features to distinguish their volume from other works on vagueness:

In accordance with the broad array of challenges provided by the phenomenon of vagueness, we strive at interdisciplinarity. The list of contributors includes philosophers, linguists, logicians, mathematicians, and computer scientists.

All papers have not only been peer reviewed, but are accompanied here by comments of other experts. These comments and the replies by the authors document intensive debates at the frontier of contemporary research -- in some cases crossing and reflecting on disciplinary boundaries. (p. vi)

We can thus expect papers from a wide range of contributors, with comments and replies. We should expect the volume to be interestingly interdisciplinary; we may expect interaction between disciplines.

But what we get is a conference proceedings. The volume is a proceedings for a conference on vagueness, not on understanding vagueness, nor on interdisciplinary approaches to vagueness, nor on logical models of reasoning with vague information. The comment and reply format of the volume is reminiscent of conference question-and-answer sessions: sometimes helpful, sometimes not.

The volume does bring together an impressive range of experts from different disciplines and engages them in something like conversation. From this we can extract components of the logical, philosophical and linguistic perspectives on vagueness. There are, however, few discussions explicitly on these perspectives or on their interaction. The prominent exceptions that directly tackle interdisciplinary issues are Thomas Vetterlein's " Vagueness: A Mathematician's Perspective", Didier Dubois' "Have Fuzzy Sets Anything to do with Vagueness?", and "A Conversation about Fuzzy Logic and Vagueness" between Fermüller and Hájek. The linguistics perspectives provided by Stephanie Solt and Ulrich Sauerland are commendable efforts to combine work from other fields with their own perspectives.

Before discussing individual papers, I should disclose my allegiances. I am a philosopher; this biases my interest towards the philosophy in the volume and to discussions easily accessible to philosophers. This, and the fact that this review is for a philosophy audience, plays a significant role in the discussion that follows.

A good place to begin reading Understanding Vagueness is its final entry. In his comments on "A Conversation About Fuzzy Logic and Vagueness", Nicholas J. J. Smith highlights three ways in which misunderstandings can arise in interdisciplinary discussions of vagueness. Philosophers, linguists and mathematical logicians are involved in different tasks; these different tasks have different focuses and different uses for logic. Smith suggests that the projects of philosophers, linguists and mathematical logicians are as follows:

1. One might want to investigate the meanings of natural language expressions. In this case one might employ a formal language whose symbols represent natural language expression types. (This is, I think, one reasonable construal of what is going on in some of the linguistics literature on formal semantics . . . )

2. One might want to investigate the truth conditions of propositions expressed by utterances of natural language sentences. In this case one might employ a formal language which looks just like the language employed in case (1), except this time the guiding idea is quite different: the symbols of the formal language represent components of (structured) propositions. (This is, I think, one reasonable construal of what is going on in some of the philosophical literature on formal logic . . . )

3. One might want to investigate various notions of logical consequence. In this case one might employ a formal language which again looks like the language employed in cases (1) and (2), except this time the symbols of the formal language are not taken to represent anything else -- or at least, whether or not they represent anything else (e.g., components of natural language sentences, or of propositions) is beside the point . . . (This is, I think, one reasonable construal of what is going on in some of the pure/mathematical logic literature . . . ) (pp. 419-420)

It is unfortunate that a clear view of these projects didn't play a prominent role in the collection. Given that this book aims at interdisciplinarity, it is surprising that authors didn't do more to explain the tasks they were engaged in. This would be fine for a collection of articles intended for experts, but if the intention was to show logical, philosophical and linguistic perspectives to those who are non-experts in at least one of these fields, then careful explanations of the perspectives and associated projects should have been provided. The summaries in the comment sections are often helpful in this regard; the editors did well in including them.

Smith's longer contribution to the volume, "Fuzzy Logic and Higher-Order Vagueness", is a good first paper. It deals with fuzzy logic from a philosophical perspective and sets up many of the concepts used in the rest of the book. Smith's work is a clear discussion of the problem of higher-order vagueness. He discusses fuzzy logic versions of model theoretic semantics and the nature of vagueness. These are useful contributions to the philosophy of logic and vagueness. Smith sets out to find a solution to the problem of artificial precision: "it is artificial/implausible/inappropriate to associate each vague predicate in natural language with a particular function which assigns one particular fuzzy truth value . . . to each object" (p. 2). He narrows down a range of solutions (using his account of what vagueness is, and the methodological criteria of this particular philosophical task) to fuzzy plurivaluationism (a theory he developed in (Smith 2001)). The content of this paper is important for anyone working in the philosophy of logic or vagueness. The problem of artificiality is one of the main philosophical objections to fuzzy logic treatments of vagueness, and Smith's discussion of it is excellent. However, most of this can be found in his book.

Thomas Vetterlein's "Vagueness: A Mathematician's Perspective" would have been more aptly entitled "Vagueness: A Mathematician's Philosophical Perspective". Vetterlein contrasts a realist and a strong anti-realist perspective on vagueness. The discussion is slanted towards the anti-realist perspective; Vetterlein says, "I am probably not capable of a fair presentation, because, naturally, I propagate only one point of view in the present context" (p. 69). Proponents of one position are allowed some blind spots when describing competing positions. But the standards of success given here, however, are excessively skewed in the anti-realist's favour; the acceptability of a theory is equated with pragmatic usefulness ("I do not want to claim that the other point of view is generally inappropriate; it has its applications"! (p. 69)). The content lacks the precision and clarity required to defend Vetterlein's main points. There is insufficient attention given to the relevant philosophical and linguistic literature. The following passage floats by without any mention of philosophers of language who have either proposed similar positions or argued against them:

What is implied when I say "the blackboard is flat"? . . . When I utter this sentence, I do not refer, consciously or unconsciously, to a universe of possible circumstances. Giving this sentence a meaning does not require a sophisticated theory. The utterance is based on my image of a flat surface as opposed to a curved one. I call the blackboard flat because I observe that it is flat, and this is turn means that my observation fits with the picture of flatness that I have in mind. As a result, the utterance evokes a corresponding picture in the imagination of the person to whom I speak. (p. 77)

Locke, anybody?

Vetterlein's contribution was very frustrating to read, but I have come to appreciate that the frustration wasn't mine alone. Perhaps the first four paragraphs of Vetterlein's reply to Fermüller's comments should be read before the main paper. Vetterlein is frustrated with how philosophers have handled the foundations of this area of mathematics. He should be praised for venturing outside of mathematics and attempting to bridge the apparent divide. A charitable philosopher can engage with many parts of the paper. There is an opportunity here; I hope someone takes it up. That said, I am surprised the paper was included in the collection. I am grateful that it is now accessible to a wide audience, and hope that there will be some forum for continued discussion, but it is impossible to pretend it is high quality philosophy, mathematics, or linguistics.

Galit Sassoon's "Comparison of Complex Predicates" and Sauerland's "Vagueness in Language" present and reflect on experimental results. They provide a linguistics perspective on the study of vagueness: specifically, a linguistics perspective on fuzzy logic as a model for understanding meaning in natural language. They use surveys of speakers' preferences and intuitions to test these models. There is recent interest in this issue as results from (Ripley 2011) and (Alxatib and Pelletier 2011) show that previous arguments against fuzzy logic approaches are not confirmed by experimental data. Sauerland provides an excellent discussion of these orthodox objections to fuzzy logic. Both papers are good examples of how experimental linguistics can engage with theoretical fuzzy logic.

Sassoon investigates predicates of the form "More P and Q" and "More P or Q". If a subject is presented with pairs of objects that agree on their degree of P but differ on their degree of Q, then (certain) fuzzy analyses of natural language suggest that exactly one of the following three options hold between the objects: (i) more P and Q, (ii) less P and Q and (iii) equally P and Q. In contrast, non-fuzzy approaches predict that none of the options will be selected by subjects, as the objects are not related by more P and more Q, less P and less Q or equally P and equally Q. Fuzzy approaches can give more and less wider scope, allowing complex predicates to apply in degrees, where other approaches do not. Sassoon's results tend to favour non-fuzzy approaches, but there are caveats and complexities that remain open for investigation.

Sauerland's paper also investigates compositionality and fuzzy logic. He aimed at eliciting responses from participants to determine whether speakers will assign the same level of truth to A&~A and A&~B, when they assign the same level of truth to A and B. There was some evidence of a difference between contradictions and mere conjunctions. In particular, the agreement with the contradictions was higher than with the mere conjunctions. Any fuzzy logic analysis of natural language needs an explanation of this failure of compositionality.

In "Inconstancy and Inconsistency", David Ripley discusses similar experimental results in the context of inconsistent and inconstant (or context-shifting) theories of vagueness. Ripley considers explanations of data from the studies (Ripley 2011) and (Alxatib and Pelletier 2011). Participants in experiments were happy to agree (to some extent) with apparent contradictions, for example "The circle both is and isn't near the square" and "Person n is tall and not tall". Inconsistent explanations give vague predicates inconsistent extensions: there are objects both in and out of the extension. Inconstant explanations suggest that the agreement is due to inconstancy of context: participants don't interpret the sentences as contradictions, since they associate different contexts with each conjunct. Ripley argues that no data from the studies can tell these explanations apart. He proves an equivalence between the two explanations: for any inconstancy model there is a inconsistent model and vice versa. This relies on some flexibility in what counts as a context; Ripley's final lesson for us is that we must clarify this concept.

In "Vagueness in Quantity: Two Case Studies from a Linguistic Perspective", Solt discusses the vague quantifiers many, few, much, and little, and contrasts most with more than half. These expressions have many of the features of typical vague predicates. Any account of vague predicates should be capable of extension to other vague terms. Solt proposes an extension of a comparison class account of vague expressions to include vague quantifiers. The sentence "Fred is tall" can be interpreted as that Fred is taller than some standard height determined by a comparison class of people. The comparison class is context sensitive (in some cases it may be the men in Australia, in other cases it may be the people in Japan). The sentence "Few students attended the lecture" can receive a similar interpretation if the legitimate comparison classes can include sets of sets of individuals, rather than sets of individuals. Solt gives interpretations for examples involving vague quantifiers by using comparison classes. Other perspectives on vagueness should find interesting research opportunities by adapting Solt's main methodology of exploring extensions of theories to include vague quantifiers and other less studied vague terms. Both case studies are good examples of the linguistics perspective and nicely combine theories of vagueness with linguistic perspectives on non-standard quantifiers.

Christoph Roschger's paper baffles me; rather, the editors handling of it baffles me. Roschger gives a clear discussion on contexts as used in linguistics, and some ways in which they can be applied to vagueness (in particular: Barker (2002), and Kyburg and Morreau (2000)). Roschger's main result purports to show that, under certain conditions, the approaches of Barker and of Kyburg and Morreau give the same predications. He does establish some connection between the approaches but, as pointed out by Ripley in his comments, the purported theorem has counterexamples. Roschger attempts to patch up the result in his response to Ripley. Roschger's paper was refereed and accepted, but then Ripley found errors in the purported theorem. Why was a faulty theorem included in the final version? It is interesting, from a sociological perspective, to observe the back and forth between Roschger and Ripley. We see some of the process that usually leads to finished journal articles. It seems, however, that the paper and the resulting exchange shouldn't appear in a collection of the quality this one claims to be. That is not to say that the paper should have been rejected, but neither should it have been published in its current form.

Michael Freund focuses his attention on a part of categorisation theory: categorical membership of definable concepts. The project is to produce a theory of the degree to which an object falls under a defined concept. Freund's intuitions are surprisingly strong. Some of his early examples include: "being a vertebrate, a fish, for example, has more mammalhood than a worm, and less than a cow; a normed (incomplete) vector space is not quite a Banach space but it is closer than, say, the set of odd numbers; a bat, finally, has somehow more birdhood than a mouse although it is definitely not a bird." (p. 97) This is the justification for saying the concepts mammal, Banach space, and bird are vague. The approach uses the degree to which an object falls under the concepts in the definiens to determine the level of categorical membership of the definiendum. This requires a qualitative partial ordering of the definiens concepts. As with many of the papers in this volume, I found it very difficult to judge the merit of the work. The collection is, with respect to interdisciplinary range, as the editors intended. This often means that authors are working in perspectives not obvious to the reader. It is difficult to achieve a balance between interdisciplinary range, cutting edge research, and interdisciplinary interaction. This volume is off kilter.

In the last few years, there has been an attempt by some philosophers and logicians to solve paradoxes with non-transitive consequence relations and non-transitive entailment (for example: Cobreros, Égré, Ripley, and Rooij (2012) and Ripley (forthcoming)). Robert van Rooij's "Vagueness, Tolerance and Non-transitive Entailment" is an important stage of this approach; it is the origin of more thorough work (Cobreros, Égré, Ripley, and Rooij 2012). Paradoxes arise in situations where there are apparently acceptable yet incompatible principles and consequences. Approaches to solving paradoxes either limit the principles, limit the consequences, or show there is no incompatibility. The non-transitive approach aims to keep the principles (in this case, the principle of tolerance) while limiting which consequences hold. In particular, the consequence relation is not assumed to be transitive. The sorites paradox is resolved because multiple uses of tolerance cannot be combined. Anyone actively working on paradoxes should read this paper, but should not expect a detailed discussion of what it takes for a relation to be a consequence relation, when inferences are permitted or when entailments hold. Given that there is a traditional assumption of transitivity, there is a lot of philosophy for this movement to sort out. This is an important contribution to the philosophy of logic, and it is still unclear where it will lead.

In "Standpoint Semantics: A Framework for Formalising the Variable Meaning of Vague Terms", Brandon Bennett develops a supervaluation style framework. He calls it a semantic framework and "a formal model for interpreting vague languages" (p. 261). Semantics and interpretations are further examples of where we should be careful in interdisciplinary work. We should be careful to establish what roles they play in the different perspectives. The collection doesn't adequately deal with this. Bennett's project is to develop a formal system that is suitable for "the construction of a knowledge representation language that is intended to articulate information of a similar kind to that conveyed by natural language communication" (p. 261). The "purpose of the current paper is to flesh out the details of a particular variant of supervaluation semantics and to develop an expressive formal representation language that could be employed within information processing applications." (p. 262).

Is he successful? One of the challenges of interdisciplinary work is to provide clear measures of success for readers from other disciplines. Many of the contributions lack this feature. In this case, it leaves me unable to determine whether Bennett is successful. He aims at modelling both conceptual and sorites vagueness (the latter is what philosophers call vagueness, and the former is ambiguity or under-determination of meaning). Both types of vagueness are relativised to an agent's standpoint. Bennett's contribution seems important for researchers in his area. The ensuing cat-fight between Peter Milne and Bennett is entertaining and worth reading.

Henri Prade and Steven Schockaert provide an information processing perspective in "Handling Borderline Cases Using Degrees". They claim that "in information processing settings, borderline cases usually are a matter of degree, or at least ranking, although such degrees may serve different purposes" (p. 291). They provide three areas in which degrees can be used in information processing. There are gaps between this evidence and their claim (Are these really cases of borderlines? Are there non-degree approaches that work better? Should we generalise on this small sample?). Philosophers might be interested in exploring whether the utility of degrees in information processing has any significance for the philosophy of vagueness. Prade and Schockaert provide a reasonably clear and accessible discussion of using degrees to deal with some vagueness-like situations.

"Have Fuzzy Sets Anything to do with Vagueness?" No, according to Dubois. The absence of any clear characterisation of vagueness makes answering the question more difficult. Dubois reminds us that vague terms often have borderline cases, unsharp boundaries and are susceptible to sorites paradox, but in a few pages this changes to "vagueness refers to some uncertainty of meaning" (p. 313). The unifying argument is difficult to follow. There is some hasty philosophising, at the beginning of section four, on traditional theories of truth and logic. These difficult topics are sailed over in a couple of paragraphs. The central section, however, deserves consideration. Dubois suggests that we should distinguish between "asserting a gradual statement" and "receiving a gradual statement". This is an interesting push towards a pragmatics-based distinction between graduality and vagueness.

Marco Cerami and Pere Prado provide technical frameworks for counterfactuals where antecedents and consequents have fuzzy truth values. They provide three approaches based on the Lewis-Stalnaker style analysis (roughly, the truth of "If A were the case, then B would be the case" depends on whether B is true in the most similar possible worlds where A is true). They adapt this by considering similar worlds where A has (a) the value 1, (b) a value greater than some fixed fuzzy value, and (c) a value higher than it actually has. The paper focuses on the technical development of the systems; there is little or no argument for the appropriateness of their approaches. Ondrej Majer's comments push Cerami and Pardo on some of their assumptions; these comments are a useful addition to the paper.

Tommaso Flaminio, Lluís Godo and Enrico Merchioni give a comprehensive account of "Reasoning About Uncertainty of Fuzzy Events". More specifically, they give a detailed account of combining fuzzy logic with measure theoretic approaches to reasoning about events. This is a plausible way to combine fuzzy truth, which comes in degrees, and uncertainty of belief, represented by a plausibility, probability or some other type of measure. The overview is detailed and thorough. In addition, Tomáš Kroupa provides a good summary of each section in his comments.

The volume ends with an enjoyable "Conversation" between Fermüller and Hájek on whether researchers in mathematical fuzzy logic, philosophy of vagueness and linguistics have anything to learn from each other. While it is enjoyable, it isn't much more than chitchat. It is worth a quick read, if one has the book already, but not worth getting the book for.

The book is littered with language abuses: typing errors, grammatical atrocities, and muddled sentences. Anyone with a weak stomach for this is advised to steer clear. One particularly ghastly example (the straw that finally broke this reviewer's back) is:

In [17] an analysis of sorites is offered using a hedge At -- "almost true". Consider the axioms: bold(0) and (n)(bold(n) ? At(bold(n+1))), where (bold(n) represents the proposition that a man with n hears on his head is bold. (from "A Conversation About Fuzzy Logic and Vagueness", p. 413.)

There is too much shoddy writing in the collection. This is ultimately a failure of the editors. It is difficult to believe that the editors of the volume fulfilled their role, between the varying quality of papers, the Roschger-Ripley incident, the outrageous number of linguistic and typographic errors, and, to top it all off, inconsistent bibliography styles.


Alxatib, Sam and Pelletier, Jeff (2011) The psychology of vagueness: borderline cases and contradictions, Mind and Language 26, pp. 287-326.

Barker, Chris (2002) The dynamics of vagueness, Linguistics and Philosophy, 25, pp. 520-530.

Cobreros, P., Égré, P., Ripley, D. and Rooij, van R. (2012) Tolerant, classical and strict, Journal of Philosophical Logic, 41, pp. 347-385.

Kyburg, A and Morreau, M (2000) Fitting words: Vague language in context. Linguistics and Philosophy, 8, pp. 339-359.

Ripley, David (2011) Contradictions at the borders. In R. Nouwen, R. van Rooij, U. Sauerland, H.-C. Schmitz (eds.) Vagueness in Communication. Springer, pp. 169-188.

Ripley, David (forthcoming) Paradoxes and failure of cut, Australasian Journal of Philosophy.

Smith, Nicholas J. J. (2001) Vagueness and Degrees of Truth. Oxford University Press.