Universality in Set Theories: A Study in Formal Ontology

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Manuel Bremer, Universality in Set Theories: A Study in Formal Ontology, Ontos, 2010, 125pp., $93.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380712.

Reviewed by M. Randall Holmes, Boise State University


I am very interested in books and articles like this one which lie at the border of philosophy and set theory. There is an unfortunate difficulty with such studies: they are usually written by philosophers rather than set theorists, and it is vitally important in such a study to get the technical details right. The technical details bear strongly on the philosophical issues. This book, very interesting to me in conception, labors under this difficulty. The philosophical issues related to the issue of the existence of a universal set are laid out, but the discussion of central mathematical issues and of particular theories is marred by technical errors and confusions which are sometimes distracting and sometimes seem to call Bremer 's philosophical conclusions into question. I am not saying that philosophers cannot write technically correct books about the philosophy of set theory. Very impressive books have been written by David Lewis ([4]), Mary Tiles ([7]), and A. W. Moore ([6]), for example, which ably deal with both philosophical and technical mathematical issues.

The brief introduction (pp. 7-11) correctly (in my opinion) lays out certain issues and strategies central to what follows. Bremer states that set theories are ontologies: this seems entirely sensible both from a philosophical standpoint and from a mathematician's standpoint as to what set theory is for. Set theories are theories of collections of objects, themselves reified as objects. In connection with a particular set theory, we might have occasion to consider (informally) the collection of objects of that theory and the domain(s) over which quantified variables range in that theory. It is reasonable to ask whether these collections (informally speaking) are among the collections actually considered as objects of the theory. Is there a universal set? Are the ranges of quantifiers in the theory sets? This is the problem of "universality".

Bremer discusses issues of epistemology in mathematics and the issue of the "real existence" of mathematical objects (Platonism) only to say that he does not address these issues here. He briefly discusses how a Platonist on the one hand and an anti-realist on the other might read the text, and suggests that it might be useful to either of them, but would be read in different ways by each. The issue for Bremer is whether the universal set should be taken to exist in set theory in its own internal terms, leaving aside the issue of how mathematical existence in general is to be understood. This seems to be a reasonable approach.

Bremer singles out the state of affairs in ZF, where certain collections (such as the universe) are ruled not to be "sets" in the sense of the internal theory. He states that this ontological position will be evaluated in what follows.

A recurring defect of this book is first manifest on p. 13. Bremer says:

The antinomies (like Russell's Paradox) are often taken as showing that Naive Comprehension

(NC1)(∃y)(∀x)(x ∈ y ≡ φ(x))

(NC2)(∀F)(∃y)(∀x)(x ∈ y ≡ F(x))

is wrong.

For either the first-order or second-order formulation given, there are simply no grounds for the qualification "are often taken as", unless one postulates major modifications to logic. Bremer keeps returning to remarks that Naive Comprehension is justified in some limited contexts: these are in all cases either errors or confusions, before the later excursion into "paraconsistency", on which I have different comments.

An example of what I take to be a confused discussion of the merits of Naive Comprehension is found on p. 15:

Comprehension is fine as long as we restrict the domain of objects to be comprehended. If we assume that there is no universal set or domain even Naive Comprehension need not lead to the antinomies, as one cannot take for granted that R (or a similar cause of trouble) belongs to the objects (sets) to be comprehended.

There is no way to make sense of this. The first sentence might be taken as talking about Zermelo's Axiom of Separation (just briefly introduced and discussed in the text at this point). But the remainder is incoherent. Naive Comprehension includes as an instance (x)(y)(yx ≡ ¬y y). This asserts the existence of an object R, necessarily in our domain of discourse on any reasonable understanding of the existential quantifier, such that (∀y)(y R ≡ ¬y y) is true, and in particular R R ≡ ¬R R is true. This conclusion cannot be avoided, or regarded as acceptable, without major adjustments to logic, which Bremer is not yet proposing. Now I am willing to charitably suppose that he is equivocating between Naive Comprehension in the sense formally stated above and naive comprehension as found in mathematics which says that any collection of mathematical objects of some sort (say numbers) can be regarded as a mathematical object, but of a different sort, say "sets of numbers"; this is an essential feature of the naive mathematical construction, and overlooking it may be taken to be the error in Frege's proposal of the capitalized Naive Comprehension. We look forward and see Bremer claiming (p. 16) that Russell's paradox demonstrates not that not all properties have extensions, but that there is no universal set. On the face of it, this is absurd: Russell's paradox shows precisely that the property of non-self-membership has no extension. But in the preceding paragraph Bremer qualifies the notion of a property having an extension as relative to a base set. On this understanding, saying that all properties have extensions (relative to any base set) expresses Zermelo's axiom of separation, not Naive Comprehension, and of course the axiom of separation implies that there is no universal set by a version of the Russell argument. This involves unfortunate use of terminology (Bremer cannot properly equivocate between Separation and Naive Comprehension in this way, because he elsewhere explicitly contrasts them) but it could be argued that no mathematical error is involved.

Another confusing statement about Naive Comprehension is made on p. 22 and reiterated on p. 99: on p. 99 he flatly says that "Naive Comprehension is consistent on the finite sets" (he clearly means hereditarily finite sets here). It is not possible to make sense of this assertion in either context. On p. 22 he says correctly that the set of all hereditarily finite sets which are not members of themselves fails to cause a problem for us because it is infinite (and so not a hereditarily finite set) but it does not thereby cease to be an explicit example of the failure of Naive Comprehension relativized to the domain of hereditarily finite sets (or merely finite) sets.

A philosophical issue which comes out in the axiomatization of ZFC and is correctly identified by Bremer as important is the fact that the quantifiers in ZFC range over all sets, which conflicts with what he calls the Domain Principle (and ascribes to Cantor): this is the assertion that quantification over a domain presupposes the existence of that domain as a completed totality. I point out that this could mean two different things: the completeness of the domain might mean that each of the objects in the domain exists (if read this way, the principle would reduce to Quine's dictum that to be is to be the value of a bound variable) or it might mean (and this is how Bremer reads it) that the domain itself must be reified as an object. However, a philosophical discussion of ZFC requires a critical attitude toward the Domain Principle (hereinafter taken as Bremer reads it). One must be open to the view that this "principle" is wrong (this is, by the way, my considered opinion). If one takes the axioms of ZFC seriously, one is tacitly taking the position that this principle is wrong (the mathematically equivalent NBG (which has proper classes) is arguably compliant with the Domain Principle). Bremer seems to think that the set theoretical Reflection Principle allows one to avoid the truly universal quantification implicit in ZFC; I do not agree.

The Domain Principle can motivate an alternative development of set theory not discussed by Bremer, but which I will briefly outline to cast some light on the issue here. If one starts with Zermelo set theory and restricts one's language to disallow quantification over all sets, requiring every quantifier to be restricted to a set, one obtains a version of the set theory called "bounded Zermelo set theory" or "Mac Lane set theory". (Strictly speaking it is not the same theory because in Mac Lane set theory one is allowed to write sentences with unbounded universal quantifiers, but not to use them in instances of separation. The theory considered here has more limited means of expression, though it has the same theorems expressible in this limited format). One also needs to rephrase certain axioms which are unavoidably general in character in schematic form (using term constructions to avoid existential quantifiers): for example the axiom of Power Set takes the form

x P(y) ≡ (∀z x.z y).

Bremer attempts (pp. 110-13) to criticize the use of schematic assertions to avoid explicit universal quantification (and any presupposition of a domain of discourse as a reified object); I am unconvinced that this is problematic. Mac Lane set theory is strong enough to do almost all mathematics outside of set theory, though it is a bit weaker than Zermelo set theory and much weaker than ZFC. It is exactly as strong as the impredicative theory of types, to which it is conceptually closely related. I observe that it appears that the Domain Principle can be satisfied in a quite standard set theory, though I also maintain that the Domain Principle is itself quite open to question. For an extended study of Mac Lane set theory, see [5].

Considerations of space in this review limit my discussion of the next chapters on Limitation of Size and Virtual Sets and Constructivism. I do note on p. 33 a frank error: NBG is not a stronger theory than ZFC (its consistency strength is the same and it proves no assertion about sets that ZFC cannot prove) and NBG does not allow the definition of a model of ZFC. This is related to an omission: in the discussion of "virtual" theories of sets and classes one should mention NBG, which is in some sense almost a theory of this type: it extends a virtual theory of classes over ZFC only in having more powerful means of expression, namely the ability to quantify over all classes, though not having the ability to use these more powerful means of expression to prove more theorems about sets. Bremer does in these sections discuss issues surrounding the set/class distinction and the distinction between first- and second-order logic which involve introducing more than one basic sort of object: these are issues which must be raised in a philosophical treatment along these lines.

An idea which Bremer expresses (not very clearly) on p. 28 and at some other points in the discussion is the idea that V (the universe of ZFC) should be taken to be a unique object (not one of many proper classes) in order to satisfy the Domain Principle. It would have been a good idea to actually give a formal presentation of a theory of this kind to make it clear what is meant; it is then clear what is meant and how it bears on the Domain Principle. I had quite a bit of trouble figuring out what Bremer was talking about on p. 28, which an explicit description of a theory with such a unique V would have cleared up. I do this here, presenting a theory equivalent to ZFC in mathematical power (a cosmetic modification of NBG) which appears to avoid objections based on the Domain Principle. This theory has a unique proper superclass U rather than a unique proper class V, but the fundamental idea is the same. Objects of this theory are called superclasses. The only proper superclass is a distinguished object called U, with the property that all superclasses (including U itself) belong to U. Superclasses with the same elements are asserted to be equal (extensionality). A class is defined as a superclass not equal to U. A set is defined as a superclass which is an element of a class (here we regard sets as special classes and classes as special superclasses; in his treatment Bremer is reluctant to identify classes that are not proper with the sets with the same extension: it is convenient and harmless to do so). The comprehension axiom scheme for classes states that for any formula φ(x) in which each quantifier is restricted to a class and all parameters are classes, the class of all sets x such that φ(x) exists (just as in NBG). We further provide the axioms of Pairing, Power Set, Union, and Infinity for sets, and the axiom of Limitation of Size: a class C is not a set iff there is a class bijection between C and the class V of all sets (notice that V is not the same as U: V contains all and only the sets as elements, whereas U contains all the proper classes (and itself!) as elements as well). It is obvious that this theory has a model iff NBG has a model (this is just a matter of adding or removing a single object with the properties of the proper superclass U). It is well-known that NBG has a model iff ZFC has a model. It is clear that the universe of all objects of the theory is an object of the theory (U) and that the domains of all quantifiers are objects of the theory (since U will always work as a bound). Further, the predicative class comprehension axiom is well known to be equivalent to a finite collection of its instances, so there is no danger of misinterpreting the comprehension scheme as involving some kind of quantification over all properties. This theory is impeccable from the standpoint of the Domain Principle and the way in which this is achieved is trivial, which casts doubt on the real effectiveness of the Principle. Notice that the proper superclass U is mathematically entirely useless: no set or class construction of the theory can be applied to U in any interesting way; in particular, we have no ability to use properties to determine subcollections of U. The subcollections of U which are reified are U itself and all the subcollections of the smaller class V definable using bounded formulas.

In the next section, Bremer discusses set theories with a universal set. I pass over the discussion of the set theory or family of set theories proposed by Church to consider Bremer's discussion of New Foundations and related systems. This discussion is marred by serious errors, though he does point out some of the important issues which would have to appear in a philosophical analysis of NF and NFU. The first failing of this treatment is that Bremer does not succeed in giving a coherent definition of the notion of stratification (p. 51). He emphasizes a point which would need to be central to a philosophical analysis of NF(U): Cantor's Theorem in its naive form fails in NF (or NFU) because it can be proved that the set of singleton sets (which must, by a stratified version of Cantor's argument, be strictly smaller than the power set of the universe, that is the collection of all sets) is smaller in cardinality than the universe, from which it follows that the singleton "map" is not a set (as if it were it would witness the set of singletons being the same size as the universe and strictly smaller than the collection of all sets, which would be a contradiction). The version NFU of New Foundations in which urelements are allowed was defined and shown to be consistent by R. B. Jensen in 1969 (in [3]; it was not developed by me in my 2005 (sic, actually 1998) book [2] as Bremer seems to assert on p. 51). The system of my book which he calls NFU is a strict extension of the theory properly called NFU. Bremer makes confused statements about the primitive ordered pair in the extension of NFU in my book (ordered pairs are not a special kind of object in this theory). He notes the important fact that the membership relation is not a set relation in NFU, so though the domain V of a model of NFU is an object in that model, the model itself (the structure (V, ∈)) is not an object in that model (otherwise the theorems of Gödel would show us that NFU is inconsistent). NF disproves Choice; NFU is consistent with Choice, and the argument for the failure of Choice in NF shows in NFU that most objects in the universe are urelements, and that the collection of all sets is (much) smaller than the collection of all objects. Another disconcerting fact in NF or NFU which a philosophical treatment would need to make sense of is that the natural well-ordering on the ordinals in a set model of NF or NFU is not a well-ordering from an external standpoint, though of course it is one in internal terms. Bremer asserts in closing that while NF or NFU provides support for ordinary mathematics, the nonexistence of the graph of the membership relation and the curious consequences of Specker's theorem cancel these gains. I agree that certain counterintuitive features of NF or NFU make them harder to use as one's working set theory than ZFC and related theories, but disagree with Bremer (on the basis of experience) as to which features they are, and I think that a philosophical analysis based on a better understanding of the theories might have cast some light on these pragmatic difficulties.

Bremer next turns to something with which he is obviously deeply concerned, which I am less familiar with, and against which I will turn one of his own arguments. It is true that there are systems of "paraconsistent logic" under which something like the axiom of Naive Comprehension can be "consistently" postulated (whatever this means in a theory where contradictions or failures of Excluded Middle are allowed). On pp. 63-64 Bremer criticizes a system of Brady's for messing with generally accepted fundamentals of our understanding of the concept of negation; he says the burden of proof lies with Brady to justify meddling with the usual understanding of negation in order to recover Naive Comprehension. I note that the same argument applies with considerable force to any attempt to meddle with non-contradiction or excluded middle (generally accepted fundamental properties of the concept of negation!) in order to recover an axiom that looks like Naive Comprehension. Further, this is a misguided enterprise in my opinion because Naive Comprehension was posed incorrectly to begin with: in actual mathematics, we allow properties to determine arbitrary collections of objects of a given sort, which we reify as objects of a different sort, which motivates not Naive Comprehension but the Separation Axiom of Zermelo or the Comprehension Axiom of type theory (depending on whether we regard sorts as sets or not).

A further point about such systems is that they are generally so mathematically weak as to be useless. Bremer himself notes that these theories at least threaten to collapse the hierarchy of infinities to a single infinite magnitude (which implies that the very standard mathematical reasoning in Cantor's diagonal argument is impossible to implement). A study of set theories as formal ontology must have as one of its desiderata the preservation of the ability of set theory to serve its intended purpose as an ontological basis for classical mathematics. I am not familiar with the specific theories Bremer describes in this section, so cannot make informed statements about their mathematical power, other than to quote what he said, which seems to support what I say above. But I am quite familiar with systems studied by Libert, Esser, Forti and others, alluded to by Bremer only in a footnote, which are paraconsistent set theories (though presented in a classical framework) and definitely have the property of being quite weak unless additional assumptions are made (whose power appears to depend strongly on working in a classical ambience). Further, these systems of paraconsistent set theory are closely related to systems of positive set theory (with entirely classical logic) developed by the same group of researchers which are a major line of development in set theory with a universal set and are not mentioned in this monograph at all (I regard this as a significant deficiency). Olivier Esser's [1] is a good paper to read as an entry point to these positive set theories.

I emphatically do not reject the study of paraconsistent logic as a branch of logic. The logical systems described seem interesting and a system in which some consequences can be deduced from unrestricted Naive Comprehension without incoherence would have technical interest. What I do believe is that no motive Bremer suggests justifies regarding such developments as anything but peripheral to the issue of what the best approach to set theory as a formal ontology should be. I note that he has not chosen to investigate systems of set theory in which constructive (intuitionistic) rather than paraconsistent logic is used to replace classical logic: there has been considerable work done on such systems and they are very interesting.

The final section on broader ontological reflections is to my mind seriously reduced in value by Bremer's determination to promote paraconsistent approaches, which I regard as poorly motivated. A discussion of the ontology of the usual set theory ZFC (about which quite a lot can be said), contrasted with the ontologies of the set/class theories and the classical theories with universal set which were briefly introduced earlier would have been more useful. Bremer's uncritical attitude toward the Domain Principle mars the philosophical discussions in the book in general, and in this section in particular. A more careful exposition of the idea to which he returns repeatedly that the universe of ZFC is in some sense "incomplete" would also be useful (this is an interesting and important idea which does need attention). There is some discussion of this on pp. 110-3, but Bremer cannot get away from the idea that quantification is tied to a domain of definition; I do not find it difficult to see approaches to untying this knot. On pp. 114-6 there is a quite unsatisfactory discussion of Bremer's notion of V as a unique limit object, of which I give a sample implementation in a concrete theory above. A specific unsatisfactory feature of his discussion is that, contrary to what he says, a unique V of the kind he discusses is not any kind of limit obtainable by simply iterating the construction of the hierarchy of set theory: it is an exceptional object added by fiat to an essentially arbitrarily chosen "stopping point" in the cumulative hierarchy (as explicitly seen above in the model construction I give). The merit of Bremer's concept, which he does not see himself, is that it completely dispels the problem of the Domain Principle by revealing that it has no mathematical content, as it can be satisfied by an essentially trivial maneuver.

I believe that there is a niche for a philosophical treatment of set theory with a universal set based both on a firm technical grasp of the systems of set theory involved (necessarily involving some mathematically correct technical exposition at a basic level) and a correct understanding of the philosophical issues. This book does not fill this niche, though it suggests what ought to go there. A further criticism of the book which I am not sure how to place is that the book has not been effectively proofread for correct English. There are some very awkward and occasionally incomprehensible sentences to be found; "NF is Quine's set theory with a universal set that is not just virtual is NFU" (p. 51) is a particularly bad example.


[1]Esser, Olivier, "On the consistency of a positive theory," Mathematical Logic Quarterly, vol. 45 (1999), no. 1, pp. 105-116.

[2]Holmes, M. R., Elementary set theory with a universal set, volume 10 of the Cahiers du Centre de logique, Academia, Louvain-la-Neuve (Belgium), 1998, 241 pages, ISBN 2-87209-488-1. There is an errata slip on the author's web page. By permission of the publishers, a corrected text is published online on the author's web page; an official second edition will appear online eventually.

[3]Jensen, R.B., "On the consistency of a slight(?) modification of Quine's NF," Synthese 19 (1969), pp. 250-263.

[4]David Lewis, Parts of Classes (with an appendix by John P. Burgess, A. P. Hazen, and David Lewis), Basil Blackwell, Oxford, 1991. 165 pages.

[5]Mathias, Adrian, "The Strength of Mac Lane Set Theory," Annals of Pure and Applied Logic, 110 (2001) 107-234.

[6]Moore, A. W., The Infinite. (London: Routledge, 1990) A revised second edition, with a new preface, was published in 2001.

[7]Tiles, Mary, The Philosophy of Set Theory: An Historical Introduction to Cantor's Paradise, Blackwell, Oxford 1989 (reprinted by Dover 2004).