Va savoir! De la connaissance en général

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Pascal Engel, Va savoir! De la connaissance en général, Hermann, 2007, 256pp., €25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9782705666095.

Reviewed by Paul Egré, CNRS, Institut Jean-Nicod


In contemporary French the colloquial expression "Va Savoir!" is commonly used to express ignorance on the part of the person who utters it, and more specifically, to express surprise and scepticism at some peculiar fact whose explanation remains mysterious. For instance, "Va savoir pourquoi Marie porte un chapeau aujourd'hui!" could be translated as "who knows why Marie is wearing a hat today!". Taken literally, however, the expression "va savoir!" is an exhortation made to the hearer to get to know the explanation of the fact in question.[1] In the introduction to his book on knowledge, Pascal Engel makes clear that he intends the title "Va savoir!" in the latter sense, as witnessed by his allusion to Kant's motto for Enlightenment, "sapere aude!" (p. 18). The ambiguity of the title chosen by Engel is in many ways emblematic of the topic of the book, namely "knowledge in general", and more specifically, of the problem of scepticism, which Engel sets out to solve. But despite the sceptical and voluntarist innuendo of the title, Engel does not uphold a voluntarist conception of knowledge (a conception discussed in chapter 4 of the book); nor is critical inquiry the main subject matter. Rather, the focus of Engel's book is on the preconditions of any inquiry, namely the "Moorean fact that we know a lot" (D. Lewis, quoted by Engel pp. 12-13), and on the defense of a dogmatist conception of knowledge against radical scepticism, a position Engel aptfully describes as neo-Moorean.

Since the book is written in French, it is worth saying something first about its background. In 2005, Julien Dutant and Pascal Engel coedited a source book in French on analytic epistemology, entitled Philosophie de la connaissance -- Croyance, connaissance, justification (Vrin, Paris), in which they collected translations of influential papers in analytic epistemology, including classics by G. E. Moore and E. Gettier, and ranging to more recent papers from the late 1990s by D. Lewis, T. Williamson and L. Zagzebski. This was an important initiative, since in France the word épistémologie remains to a large extent bound up with a tradition of philosophy of science that includes primarily French figures like G. Bachelard, G. Canguilhem and M. Foucault, and in the foreign domain, philosophers of science like K. Popper and T. Kuhn. Until recently, for that matter, philosophy of knowledge in the analytic tradition was largely unknown, and Engel's new book can be seen as a further step to broaden the French philosophical scene, give access to a different tradition, and stimulate argumentative thinking.

The book serves two main purposes. On the one hand, it offers a general and erudite introduction to analytic philosophy of knowledge, with an explicit pedagogical intent. On the other hand, Engel proposes a distinctive contribution to the current debates in analytic epistemology, taking a position on each of the problems that he examines. The book is organized in six chapters (not including a preamble and a separate conclusion), with a final appendix providing a useful list of the topical arguments and principles discussed in the book.

Chapter 1, on theories of justification, begins with Agrippa's trilemma concerning justification (the quest for rational justification is bound to either stop arbitrarily, regress indefinitely, or go in a circle) and gives a presentation of the main dichotomies that structure the field: internalism vs. externalism about justification, foundationalism vs. coherentism, fallibilism vs. infallibilism. Gettier's problem is presented along the way, and the chapter gives a smooth account of the criteria for knowledge respectively proposed by Lehrer, Nozick and Goldman. A pedagogical achievement of the chapter is the emphasis put by Engel on various theoretical choices, in particular regarding the problem of defining justification: is knowledge so elusive, to use Lewis's term, because the concept is in fact empty (as a brand of scepticism would have it), because it is a primitive notion (as T. Williamson has argued), or because the standards of knowledge attribution are relative (according to some versions of contextualism)?  Engel argues in favour of the second option, but considers first the two rival alternatives.

The problem of scepticism, the central focus of the book, is first introduced in chapter 2 ("Scepticisme et contextualisme"), which discusses the main contextualist strategies formulated in response to it. The chapter is a very useful compendium of the different ways of articulating the notion of context in order to avoid the sceptical conclusion resulting from the argument of ignorance (I don't know that I am not a brain in a vat; if I don't know that I am not a brain in a vat, then I don't know I have hands; therefore I don't know I have hands). Engel gives a thorough account of Dretske's relativization of knowledge to relevant alternatives, and of the rejection of the principle of epistemic closure, endorsed both by Dretske and by Nozick. The chapter contains a more specific discussion of DeRose's own version of contextualism (with a fine account of where it departs from Nozick and Dretske), and concludes with a presentation of "subject sensitive invariantism", the mildly contextualist view defended recently by Hawthorne and Stanley, whereby practical interests of the attitude-holder (but not of the ascriber) influence the truth-conditional content of knowledge and of knowledge ascriptions.

Against these different positions, Engel defends insensitive invariantism, namely the view that knowledge has a constant and context-independent meaning, both at the mental level and in knowledge attributions. The position is elaborated upon in the third and following chapters, where Engel develops an account that sides explicitly with T. Williamson's recent defense of insensitive invariantism ("Contextualism, Subject-Sensitive Invariantism, and Knowledge of Knowledge", The Philosophical Quarterly, 2005, 55: 213-55). This invariantist position is itself grounded in an externalist conception of knowledge and justification, for which Engel argues most prominently in chapters 3 and 5.

In chapter 3 ("Choses Sues"), Engel brings together the main arguments given by Williamson in favour of epistemological externalism, and ultimately, in favour of his refutation of scepticism. First, Engel endorses Williamson's view that knowledge is a mental state, individuated by external conditions. Engel then reviews Williamson's anti-luminosity argument against the KK principle, namely against the idea that knowing that one knows should be a necessary condition for knowing. Like Williamson, Engel considers more generally that one can know a proposition and be well justified in believing it, without necessarily having access to the corresponding justification. The rejection of KK reappears in chapter 5 in Engel's account of direct justification (pp. 192-93): for Engel, the sceptic requires too much when he demands a justification for my belief that I have hands. Rather, such a belief is immediately justified and, as I understand Engel's proposal, we would not even have a sense of what knowledge "feels like" if such beliefs did not count as knowledge in the first place.

Another ingredient, which Engel incorporates both from Williamson and from Sosa, is the idea that knowledge is more adequately characterized as a form of safe belief than as a form of belief counterfactually sensitive to the truth. On Williamson's account, Nozick's sensitivity condition is indeed too stringent:  for instance, if I was a brain in a vat, I would still believe I am not a brain in a vat, as the sceptic intimates, showing that my belief that I am not a BIV is not sensitive. But as Engel concurs with Williamson, that very belief can nevertheless be safe, namely true at close possibilities, considering that the sceptical alternative is not among close possibilities.

The reason why the sceptical alternative is not a close possibility is precisely the topic of chapter 5 ("La justification prima facie"), which gives the pith of Engel's neo-Moorean view and departs from Williamson's epistemology: on Engel's account, the first premise of the argument from ignorance is simply false, because our knowledge that we have hands overrides the sceptical possibility. Engel's defense of the Moorean stance rests on an account of what he calls prima facie justifications (following in particular J. Pryor in "What's Wrong with Moore's Argument?", Philosophical Issues 14, 2004: 349-78, and also C. Peacocke in The Realm of Reason, Oxford, 2004), namely justifications that are certain, immediate, and nevertheless defeasible (p. 162). In this chapter, Engel gives an extended discussion of two modes of knowledge acquisition where this notion of prima facie justification plays a crucial role: knowledge by testimony, and knowledge by perception. In the case of testimony, Engel agrees with T. Burge that it is rational to accept a testimony, unless we have prior evidence to the contrary (see T. Burge, "Content Preservation", The Philosophical Review, 102: 457-88). Similarly, in the case of perception, Engel argues that "perceptual contents give us prima facie entitlements to take things as they appear to us" (p. 187, my translation). On that account, even when the sceptic instills doubt in us, we continue to know, because the structure of knowledge compels us to rely on prima facie justifications.

As Engel admits (p. 198), the latter view introduces an internalist component into his externalist conception of knowledge. In particular, Engel seems to agree with Pryor that our perceptual experience has a "distinctive phenomenology", namely the "feeling of seeming to ascertain that a proposition is true" (Pryor 2004: 357, quoted p. 197). For Engel, this is not quite a leap into internalism, because this does not commit one to the adoption of KK. The way Engel expresses the point is the following:

the prima facie justification of a belief obtained by testimony, or of a perceptual experience implies that the subject has conscious access to his experience, or to the content of the testimony, but it does not imply that he knows he has this knowledge, and even less … that he has an antecedent warrant. (p. 199, my translation)

Here, in my opinion, lies an ambiguity in what the KK principle exactly amounts to. The way Engel understands the rejection of KK in the book concerns primarily justification: we can have a prima facie justification for some proposition p, without having an inferential justification for this prima facie justification (p. 192). Let us take an example. Suppose Ann has a conscious and reliable experience of the content of a truthful testimony (like "there are railway strikes today"), and believes it. An external ascriber can adequately report that Ann thereby knows there is a railway strike. Does Ann know that she knows there is a railway strike? The same ascriber may deny this, because the ascriber may insist that, for Ann to know that she knows, Ann must be able to prove the reliability of her testimony. I agree with this externalist intuition against the KK principle. But now suppose Ann has a perceptual experience of redness (a case mentioned by Engel on p. 196) and declares: "I see red". Then I would readily say that Ann knows she sees red, and that she knows that she knows she sees red. In that case, the ground for Ann's first-order knowledge seems to transfer to higher levels, because it rests solely on the structure of her conscious beliefs (including her declaring that knowledge). Although the point is alluded to in the book, Engel does not dwell on the difference there may be here between some varieties of perceptual experience and knowledge by testimony. Whether or not the KK principle is to be rejected, therefore, seems to depend on the mode of knowledge acquisition. The point matters, for a close examination of the book reveals that Engel's rejection of KK concerns essentially the mode of justification of knowledge, rather than the limits of awareness and self-knowledge. In the end, Engel's ground for rejecting KK does not appear to depend on Williamson's anti-luminosity argument, contrary to what chapter 3 might first suggest.

A related issue concerns Engel's defense of the Moorean stance, and his understanding of the notion of defeasibility. Let us consider Moore first: Moore knows he has hands. Does Moore know that he knows he has hands? As Engel points out, in asserting he knows he has hands, Moore thereby indicates that he knows he knows. Moreover Moore claimed certainty in his argument (p. 119). But what about the neo-dogmatist pictured by Engel? Does he know that he knows he has hands? A point worth noting here is that Engel characterizes prima facie justifications as certain but defeasible. But "defeasible" can mean two things: either defeasible in the weak sense that my prima facie justification can go wrong and lead to revisions in some cases (I am certain that I see a cat at first; I then realize it is a rat); or defeasible in the much stronger sense whereby it could turn out that the sceptic is right, and that all of our conscious experience is a dream. Clearly, Engel must mean "defeasible" in the weak sense. Otherwise we face a dilemma: if the dogmatist described by Engel knows that he has hands, but does not know that he knows (assuming his prima facie justification is indeed defeasible in the strong sense), then he himself should be in a position to say: "I know I have hands, but don't know for sure that I know this". Not only would that be an instance of Moore's paradox, but it would be very much at odds with Engel's dogmatic position, or otherwise it should lead to the kind of contextualist strategy that Engel rejects in chapter 2. The other option, I believe, is for the neo-dogmatist to grant that he knows he knows he has hands, and that his prima facie justification is not defeasible in the strong sense, but then to admit that the kind of prima facie justification for his belief he has hands transfers to higher-order knowledge (this time in tension with the overall rejection of KK, and in support of a stronger form of internalism than Engel acknowledges, but in a way less costly to Engel's strategy in my opinion).

Engel's conception of justification is investigated further in chapters 4 and 6. Chapter 4 ("Jusqu'où va la responsabilité épistémique") gives a discussion of virtue epistemology, and of deontological approaches to justification, and chapter 6 examines the scope of a priori knowledge, following up on Engel's characterization of prima facie justifications as a priori. While more peripheral to his argument, these chapters bring important qualifications to Engel's picture of knowledge. Chapter 4, in particular, discusses different degrees of doxastic voluntarism, and advocates a form of weak and indirect control over one's beliefs, in agreement with Engel's externalist conception of knowledge and justification. This dispels any suspicion of dogmatism concerning rational inquiry, a point well argued for by Engel, since on that perspective the purpose of rational inquiry is precisely to come to correct one's beliefs using reflection and method.

Chapter 6 ("L'a priori") defends a "moderately rationalist" conception of the a priori, inspired by Peacocke, whereby Engel tries to find a middle-way between Carnapian conventionalism and Kantian rationalism. This last chapter is less convincing, in my opinion, because the proposed notion of the a priori is hard to pin down, or so thin that it tends to evaporate under scrutiny. One aspect which makes the unity of the notion hard to grasp is that the concept of a priori is predicated by Engel of different kinds of objects in the chapter: of statements, of norms, but also of justifications and warrants. Rather than fixing the notion, this makes it difficult to track, for lack of a precise definition. More fundamentally, though, the notion of the a priori is presented as relative to specific transitions between experiences and judgments. However, Engel warns that such a priori transitions are fallible and presumptive only. For instance, Engel writes that:

"I am in pain" is a priori relatively, relative to my experiences of pain. But it is only a presumption: I have no guarantee that I am not mistaken in that circumstance. (p. 218, my translation)

The idea seems to be that "I am in pain" would not have the meaning it has without reference to truthful experiences of pain, even if qualitatively identical experiences can deceptively lead to that same judgment in some cases. But doesn't the concept of a priori threaten to be too broad in that case? Shouldn't we say in the same way that judging that there is a book is a priori whenever one sees a book, and similarly for any kind of true judgment based on our perceptual experience? If so, then all our truth-conditional intuitions, all our prototypical psychological associations should be declared a priori. But then it remains unclear what epistemological role is left for such a broad concept. At any rate, a more precise discussion of semantic internalism and of the notion of semantic competence would here be welcome to substantiate the claim, but this obviously lies beyond the scope of the book.

In his conclusion, Engel concedes about his neo-dogmatic position that "there is little chance that all this will satisfy the sceptic" (p. 228, translation mine). Far from undermining his main argument, however, the remark gives a fair indication of Engel's systematic method of setting up confrontations between rivals views, and of his constant attention to the limits of any argument. Pascal Engel's book is not only a reply to scepticism worth considering and discussing: the book is particularly clear, written in a style accessible and pleasant, and beautifully organized. Besides its pedagogical qualities, the book shows an impressive and highly informative mastery of the recent and classic literature in epistemology: this is particularly manifest in Engel's presentation of the debate between Clifford and James on doxastic voluntarism in chapter 4, but also in his account of the arguments that oppose conceptualists and non-conceptualists about the nature of perceptual content in chapter 5. The book should be of great value to specialists as well as students interested in knowledge and the problem of scepticism. Not only will it be valuable to French readers, but we may hope that it will soon also be available in English.

[1] As P. Engel pointed out to me, a more colloquial way of translating "va savoir!" in English might be "go figure!". I thought of "who knows" first, because know translates savoir, and to me figure is closer to the French comprendre. In French the expression "va comprendre!" also exists, and corresponds to a register slightly more familiar than "va savoir!".