Value and Context: The Nature of Moral and Political Knowledge

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Alan Thomas, Value and Context: The Nature of Moral and Political Knowledge, Oxford University Press, 2006, 347pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0198250177.

Reviewed by Jason Kawall, Colgate University


Thomas' Value and Context is an impressively ambitious and wide-ranging volume.  The book -- at over 300 pages (in a noticeably dense, small font) -- is divided into four parts, with the first defending a sensibilist moral cognitivism, the second considering rival metaethical positions, the third treating epistemic contextualism as a moral epistemology, and the fourth applying contextualism to certain key issues in political philosophy.

Part I, consisting of four chapters, has Thomas outlining and defending a form of moral cognitivism in the same family as the sensibility theories of John McDowell, and (especially) David Wiggins.  He argues that we have moral responses that are paired with moral properties (where these are captured in thick moral concepts -- 'honest', 'cruel', and the like), and that our knowledge of such properties is genuine and objective, even if dependent upon human sensibilities (and thus involves a certain subjectivity that may be absent from the sciences).  With this in hand, Thomas turns to questions of internalism and the status of moral reasons in the broader context of practical reasons.  Thomas accepts Bernard Williams' internalism requirement on practical reasons, but holds that this can still allow for moral reasons to be impartially defensible.  He suggests that fully socialized agents with a concern for morality will, because of this concern, have their reasoning shaped in such a way that they will seek reasons that cannot be reasonably rejected by others; Thomas thus holds that we need not embrace external reasons in order to accommodate impartially defensible reasons for agents.

In Part II (two chapters) Thomas focuses on rival metaethical stances.  He first provides critiques of metaethical expressivism, focusing especially on works by Simon Blackburn and Mark Timmons (and concentrating on issues of truth minimalism, Timmons' assertoric non-descriptivism, and the Frege-Geach problem).  He then turns to Bernard Williams' non-objectivism -- the view, roughly, that while ethical knowledge is possible, it fails to be strongly objective and free from perspectival influence as is scientific knowledge.  Thomas argues that internalist realist critics of Williams (including Hilary Putnam) are mistaken in holding that Williams assumes that only physical/scientific knowledge constitutes genuine knowledge, or begs the question against the possibility of ethical knowledge being part of the absolute conception of the world; Williams' non-objectivism cannot be dismissed so easily. Thomas then turns to Williams' challenge to cognitivism.  Roughly, Williams argues that even if we can have knowledge through thick ethical concepts, this knowledge will tend to be local and perspectival, and easily lost upon reflection (thus Williams' case of the hypertraditional society, where, he argues, members will lose moral knowledge if they reflect upon their practices in light of knowledge of other societies with different ethical practices).  Thomas argues against Williams, Miranda Fricker, and Adrian Moore, who hold that we moderns (faced with a plurality of ethical traditions) can still maintain ethical practices by an appeal to confidence.  Thomas' main worry concerns what this confidence is -- does it strengthen our use of remaining thick concepts and moral knowledge?  Do we have two kinds of ethical commitments -- some maintained by thick concepts, some by confidence?  Thomas argues that the proposal is unclear, and quite possibly inconsistent.

The four chapters of Part III are devoted to epistemic contextualism. Thomas suggests that a contextualist account of justification, especially as understood by Michael Williams, is our most plausible account of epistemic justification in general, and has important results when applied in the case of moral beliefs.  In particular, Thomas believes that by appropriately restricting discussion and justification of moral claims to contexts established by moral traditions, sceptical worries can be avoided.  It is not enough to merely mention the possibility of other ways of life to undermine a group's moral knowledge -- these possibilities have to be developed and shown to be genuine rivals.  (Thomas draws on Michael Williams here, roughly holding that we need only answer properly motivated challenges to knowledge claims).  Thus contextualism is taken to accommodate the moral cognitivism described in Part I, allowing individuals within various local, historical traditions to have genuine moral knowledge, while providing for internal criticism and development within these traditions, and excluding as illegitimate sceptical worries that arise from outside any genuine context.  It also allows members of modern societies to maintain genuine, reflective moral knowledge despite their awareness of rival moral traditions (contrary to Bernard Williams' claims).

Finally, in Part IV, two chapters are devoted to issues in political philosophy, with Thomas working out the requirements for a legitimate state accommodating a range of moral traditions (each with moral knowledge) in the context of a modern society.  Thomas defends Rawls' later, contextualist account of what constitutes a "legitimate conception of justice for a society marked by a certain kind of moral pluralism" (271).  In the final chapter Thomas argues that political liberalism can allow a central role for civil society and active citizenship (indeed, Thomas suggests this will be needed by political liberals to provide a motivation for restraint in deliberations with others about constitutional and legislative fundamentals). Thomas treats the resulting view as a form of liberal republicanism.  Thomas argues (against Charles Taylor) that there is no need to presuppose active citizenship as a part of a substantive conception of the good life; rather, it is treated as an optional value -- citizenship participation is not a component of a good life as such, but ensures security, and the functioning of society to allow for the pursuit of individual purposes. He grants that over time such a political liberalism will affect the background culture in which it is embedded, but argues that this is not contrary to a Rawlsian liberalism as such.

The breadth of the book is striking.  Thomas engages with a remarkable range of issues -- including (to scratch only the surface) Harman and Mackie's well-known arguments against the possibility of realist moral knowledge, the implications of truth minimalism, the nature of response-dependent concepts, the interpretation of Williams' internal reasons requirement, the nature of ideological beliefs, the rejection of epistemic realism (following Michael Williams), the understanding of the methodology of reflective equilibrium (as contextualist, rather than coherentist), Rawls' shift to contexualism, and the place of civil society and citizenship in the most plausible forms of liberalism.  Bernard Williams, John McDowell, David Wiggins, Crispin Wright, Simon Blackburn, Mark Timmons, Hilary Putnam, Ludwig Wittgenstein, Michael Williams, Charles Taylor, Charles Larmore, John Tomasi, and John Rawls -- among several others -- all make extended appearances.

A weakness in Thomas' work comes in his discussions and applications of epistemic contextualism.  He says very little to show why we should embrace contextualism; he briefly argues that it provides the most plausible available response to the sceptic and that as such it ought to be taken as our best theory of epistemic justification, while rejecting coherentism and foundationalism in the space of about twenty pages.  Of course one can produce arguments that change the course of a field in a matter of pages (Gettier comes to mind …), but this is not what happens here.  Extensive articles and books have been written on these topics while Thomas more or less presents a few arguments drawn from Michael Williams.  To be fair, one cannot discuss every possible tangent or objection to one's views, and Thomas explicitly states that it is beyond the scope of his book to defend contextualism thoroughly, and that he intends simply to make use of it with respect to moral and political knowledge.  But when so much of the latter part of the book is intended to highlight the benefits of epistemic contextualism for the moral cognitivist (and given the book's subtitle: The Nature of Moral and Political Knowledge), a more substantial defence of the position would seem in order.  Thomas does not engage with critics of epistemic contextualism in any significant fashion -- there is no mention of the critical responses to contextualism of Richard Feldman, Ernest Sosa, or Jonathan Vogel (among many others).

Thomas focuses on a rather particular understanding of contextualism -- broadly that of Michael Williams (as in Williams' Unnatural Doubts).  Thomas treats contextualism as a rival to coherentism and foundationalism, though many epistemologists would not treat contextualism as such in this way.  After all, even within a given context, we need to determine what constitutes justification, and contextualism itself (as a semantic theory) does not dictate an answer.  One could thus be an evidentialist, foundationalist, relevant alternatives theorist, or what-have-you, when it comes to the justification of beliefs within a context.  Thomas further seems to see contextualism as ruling out the need to address most sceptical questions concerning moral knowledge arising from outside of the context of a given cultural tradition.  But again this approach is not representative of most epistemic contextualists, who would hold that what level of justification an agent must achieve in order to be attributed knowledge (and what background considerations can be taken for granted) can vary from conversation to conversation even within a tradition; a context is treated as much more local by such epistemologists.  Even if Thomas is treating particular moral traditions as forms of discipline of inquiry (as in Williams' contextualism), we can engage in a reflective assessment of these disciplines and their (supposed) methodological necessities as such.  And while many epistemologists with contextualist sympathies would agree that the fact that a person does not know a proposition in a 'philosophical' context fails to show that this person therefore does not know tout court, they would not take contextualism to show these philosophical contexts (and questions arising within them) to be therefore illegitimate.  Again, Thomas seems to broadly follow Michael Williams' approach here with little consideration of objections to it.  Those sceptical of Williams' work will be so of Thomas'.

In the end, it is not clear how much work Thomas' contextualism is actually doing.  Thomas tries to show that contextualism would allow us to have knowledge of a plurality of values and goods even in modern societies.  But he gives little attention to how foundationalists and coherentists could embrace similar claims (and allow for the possibility of local moral knowledge, drawing on thick moral concepts).  In particular, moderate versions of foundationalism and coherentism would seem to have ample resources to accommodate the sensibilist cognitivism proposed by Thomas -- even in modern societies which are aware of, and may contain, a plurality of moral traditions.  He does, at times, seem to hold only that contextualism is best able to vindicate moral knowledge -- but here again, the arguments are rather quick, and little consideration is given to alternatives, or to possible objections to his contextualism.

For all this, there are several very interesting, insightful discussions in the book. Thomas is very careful in distinguishing the views of McDowell and Wiggins-- views that are often too quickly treated as a single 'sensibilist' theory.  His discussion of internal reasons and impartiality in chapter four is quite thorough, and provides a highly plausible interpretation of Bernard Williams.  Similarly, his discussion of Williams' non-objectivism (and critical responses to it) is illuminating.  And Thomas' work defending a place for active citizenship in liberal republicanism is quite convincing.

Value and Context can be a rather tough read at times as Thomas covers a great deal of ground and often enters into quite technical discussions relying on readers to have a ready grounding in the issues and positions covered.  On the other hand, a focused reader could thus benefit from cherry-picking specific discussions in Thomas' book relevant to her interests -- many of these can be read profitably in isolation from the rest of the work.  And while the discussion and application of epistemic contextualism is weak at points, this is so primarily in the sense that it is not clear that Thomas' general position requires a commitment to such a contextualism, or that he has done enough to show that rival epistemic views could not capture equally well the advantages he attributes to his contextualism (or provide others).  These particular worries do not radically undermine Thomas' distinctive sensibilist cognitivism or his defence of liberal republicanism as such.  Indeed, most readers will find much of interest in the development and defence of Thomas' interrelated positions.