Value and Virtue in a Godless Universe

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Erik J. Wielenberg, Value and Virtue in a Godless Universe, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 202pp, $20.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521607841.

Reviewed by John Cottingham, University of Reading


Wielenberg's book is a conditional apologia for naturalism. It is conditional in so far as he explicitly states that he will not argue for the truth of naturalism, but rather, on the assumption that it is true, will endeavour to acquit it of the damaging implications it is often taken to have.

A common charge is that without God human life is meaningless. Wielenberg, to his credit, rejects a number of over-easy rebuttals to this charge -- for example that if there were no God, mere preference for certain activities would be enough to endow them with meaning. This won't do, argues Wielenberg, because the excrement eater, even if endowed with a strong desire to pursue his chosen activity, does not qualify as having a meaningful life. What one might call an 'internalist' account of meaningfulness cannot rely merely on the brute fact that we like to do certain things. What is needed, in addition, is that our activities have some kind of intrinsic value: "Even if there is no supernatural commander to assign purposes to our lives or a suitably Significant Deity to care about our lives, the existence of intrinsically good activities would make it possible for us to bring internal meaning to our lives." (p. 34).

The idea of an integral connection between meaningfulness and value that is invoked here seems to me absolutely right. But how does Wielenberg's godless universe manage to contain genuine intrinsic value? On the negative side, we are taken through some of the familiar 'Euthyphro-type' arguments, for example that it is implausible to suppose that value or goodness are properties that could be bestowed by the arbitrary will of God. On the positive side, Wielenberg asserts an extremely strong form of ethical realism. Ethical truths are "part of the furniture of the universe". Moreover, they are not only objectively true, but are necessarily true, constituting the "ethical background of every possible universe." (p. 52). Yet it is not at all clear how most of the forms of naturalism currently on offer could support such universal and necessary ethical truths. Wielenberg announces at the start of the book that he is not the brash materialist kind of naturalist who believes that all facts are scientific facts or reducible to the language of physical science. But he goes on nevertheless to endorse a radically materialistic picture of the cosmos, where everything there is arises "through a combination of necessity and chance" (p. 3) from physical and chemical origins. Could such a picture of the universe allow for irreducible necessary truths of morality?

A possible analogy here might be drawn from the apriori truths of logic and mathematics: if the naturalist can account for these, why not for moral truths also? But at least there are candidates (plausible or not) for naturalist explanations of logico-mathematical truth (some types of conventionalism, for example); in the ethical case, it is far less clear how a naturalist of Wielenberg's stripe might proceed, nor are we given many clues. We are told at one point of ethical truths lying "at the very bedrock of reality, created by no-one, under no-one's control, passing judgement on the actions and character of God and man alike" (p. 67). Leaving aside the talk of "passing judgement" (which Wielenberg acknowledges to be "metaphorical"), what we are offered seems to be something like (as McDowell has termed it) 'rampant Platonism'. Yet if this is what Wielenberg's form of 'naturalism' ends up buying into -- a supposedly wholly material cosmos mysteriously conjoined with necessary values inhabiting a Platonic limbo -- one cannot but wonder why such a picture is supposed to have a decisive edge over the traditional theistic picture of a necessary being who is the eternal source of all meaning and goodness.

If the status of value in a godless universe remains obscure, how does Wielenberg fare with the second topic of his title, namely virtue? A long-standing anxiety about the rise of atheism, less commonly heard nowadays but frequently voiced throughout the early-modern period, is that without a belief in God there is every natural encouragement to vice but no reason to be virtuous. In a wide-ranging chapter (touching on the work of William Craig, C.S. Lewis and Gordon Graham, amongst others) Wielenberg shows some sympathy for the Humean line that virtue brings happiness, but ends up taking the more austere Kantian position that the only valid reason for performing one's obligations and pursuing the highest good is that, irrespective of inclination or reward, one ought to do so. So, God or no God, we do have reason to be moral, and there's an end on't. Although somewhat swift, this approach seems to offer an effective riposte to those versions of the 'Why be moral?' challenge which tend covertly to assume that the only pukka reasons for action must be self-interested ones.

Yet what becomes of the moral life if the good is unattainable, or very difficult to achieve? Here another quite distinct Kantian line of argument kicks in: that it is rationally necessary for the pursuer of the good to presuppose it can be attained, which in turn presupposes the existence of a God who can ultimately ensure its attainment. Wielenberg replies that even without such divine warrant we can still sensibly strive to attain the good; moreover, so far from bolstering our moral strivings, belief in a divine guarantee that justice will ultimately prevail can in fact often lead to moral complacency and even atrocity (as in the story of the massacre of Beziers, where the soldier who asked how the true believers could be distinguished from the heretics was told "Kill them all; God will recognize his own.")

Such disparaging anecdotes from the sorry history of religious persecution are much in evidence in the closing chapter of the book, which focuses on the consequences of widespread acceptance of Christianity. Here Wielenberg seems to me to make things far too easy for himself, by picking out various episodes from the Old Testament (why the Old?), and highlighting certain sinister "strands of thought" (the idea of a favoured chosen people, of mass slaughter of the enemy supposedly commanded by God), which are taken by implication to be typical of the religious mindset. Naturalism, we are told, is "devoid of these dangerous ideas" and replaces the divisive cry of "no God but ours" with "there is no God to help us; we are all in this together." (pp. 150, 151). In fairness, however, it should be added that Wielenberg does not duck consideration of the unparalleled horrors wrought during the twentieth century in the name of wholly secular creeds.

So what vision of the virtuous naturalist emerges by the book's end? Commendably, instead of addressing the 'easy' cases of virtues common to all cultures, Wielenberg sets himself to deal with some of the distinctively religious virtues, attempting to provide secular or naturalistic analogues for them. Humility, recognition of our dependence on God, becomes a recognition of "the tremendous contribution dumb luck has made to all human accomplishments", so that "taking the balance of credit for one's accomplishments is foolish." (pp. 110, 112). The central theological virtue of hope, maintained in the face of radical vulnerability, and the ever-present human tendency to lapse into destructiveness, becomes a confidence in the power of science to ameliorate our lot (including by pharmacological means), pointing us towards "the upper limits of justice and happiness" that "remain to be discovered" (p. 139). Whether the reader will be drawn to this vision, with its (acknowledged but repudiated) Brave New World flavour, is perhaps partly a matter of temperament. What seems to me interesting about the Wielenbergian virtues -- recognition of our dependence on fortune, and optimism about the progress of science -- is what one might call the 'thinness' of their psychological profile. Without going into whether or not they are worthy dispositions to cultivate, they are not integrated, as the religious virtues are, into a complex psychological story about self-discovery, moral growth through suffering, and changed awareness or metanoia. What Wielenberg has given us, it seems to me, are essentially static features of a rational secular outlook; there may be nothing wrong with this, but what is left out, in the process of constructing the secular analogues, is almost every motivational and psychological aspect of the spiritual life that has made the traditional religious virtues intelligible and attractive to those who aspire to them.

Even those, however, who are out of sympathy with Wielenberg's approach, and his worldview, will find much that is worthwhile in this book. It is written with verve and clarity, and is for the most part highly accessible, yet densely packed with thoughtful and often provocative ideas and arguments. It bears the hallmark of having been forged in the lecture-room through vigorous debate, and it should provoke equally vigorous discussion among students and others. Altogether, it is a useful addition to the new and exciting wave of philosophical writing that is turning the skills of analytic philosophy back upon ancient and central questions about the meaning of human existence.

A minor gripe by way of postscript: in a book elsewhere so sensitive to the needs of students, it is disappointing to find Paradise Lost referred to as "John Milton's (1956) classic", or phrases like "the method recommended by Montaigne (1966) in his essay …". This reference system, appropriate for science journals but so deeply unsuited to the humanities, is spreading like an ugly virus. If it must be used, the original dates of the works mentioned should at least be supplied somewhere, if only in the bibliography in square brackets, alongside the date of the later edition from which actual citations are taken.