Values and Virtues: Aristotelianism in Contemporary Ethics

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Timothy Chappell (ed.), Values and Virtues: Aristotelianism in Contemporary Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2006, 299pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199291454.

Reviewed by Justin Oakley, Monash University


This collection of fourteen original papers discusses a variety of Aristotelian themes in contemporary ethical thought, ranging across meta-ethics, moral psychology, and ethical theory. Versions of many chapters were originally presented at a conference organised by Chappell at the University of Dundee in 2004. There are some well-known names in the field, along with some promising newcomers. Many of the chapters build on and extend existing accounts of virtue ethics and virtues such as practical wisdom, while other chapters concentrate on scholarly concerns. The collection begins with an excellent editor's introduction, outlining each contribution and bringing out important interconnecting themes.

The opening chapter by Christopher Coope, 'Modern Virtue Ethics', is a polemical and highly opinionated critique of what he sees as the decline of Aristotelian ethics into modern virtue ethics. Writing with the "unusual fire" he says characterised his teacher, Elizabeth Anscombe, Coope seeks to demonstrate more clearly what Anscombe was calling for a return to in her article 'Modern Moral Philosophy' (1958), which many take as prompting the beginning of modern virtue ethics. Coope argues that much current work in virtue ethics is undisciplined and overly broad. He chastises Rosalind Hursthouse and Michael Slote in this regard, and argues that modern forms of virtue ethics cannot be compared with consequentialism and Kantian ethics along some common denominator of right action, as this concept is used in such a variety of ways that these comparisons are unhelpful. Drawing implicitly on Anscombian absolutism, Coope also criticises what he sees as the marginalisation of justice in much contemporary virtue ethics. Indeed, he argues that 'virtue ethics' is a term ill-suited to an Aristotelian approach, and that 'good-sense ethics' would more accurately convey the central place given to phronesis in Aristotle's ethics. Good sense, Coope suggests, should also be linked with the notion of good fortune, which he says is closer to Aristotelian eudaimonia than the concept of flourishing that serves as a basis of much contemporary virtue ethics. However, making good fortune more central than human flourishing seems to overemphasise the role of luck in Aristotle's conception of genuine happiness. Coope does offer some interesting suggestions about how Anscombe's key messages might still be taken on board. It seems a pity to begin the collection with a chapter written in such a caustic tone, and at more than twice the length of many others the chapter could have done with some pruning.

Fortunately, subsequent chapters do not take up the idea that virtue ethics talk should be abandoned, though many of the contributors do propose important revisions and extensions of current virtue ethics approaches. In 'The Admirable Life and the Desirable Life', Linda Zagzebski contends that the notion of 'flourishing' provides inadequate grounding for the claims made by Aristotelian virtue ethicists, and that the account of happiness it yields will not motivate someone to be moral in the first place. Zagzebski argues that these problems can be overcome by what she calls 'exemplarism', which she says gets us beyond a closed circle of conceptual analysis by taking virtuous exemplars as basic and building the theory from there. Summarising her recent work developing this approach, Zagzebski draws on the theory of direct reference, where a natural kind term such as water can be defined as 'whatever is the same liquid as that' (said while pointing at water). Zagzebski argues that we can do the same with a term such as 'virtuous person', as she believes we are more certain about our judgements of paradigmatically good people, such as Socrates, Jesus Christ, or the Buddha, than we are about theoretical terms used as the basis for an ethical theory. This is a novel and interesting way to develop a non-eudaimonistic virtue ethics, but it raises several further concerns. First, taking exemplars as basic seems to leave it difficult to explain why Socrates, Christ, or the Buddha are admirable or virtuous, when we should be able to provide at least some reasons for saying these things (e.g., in explaining such claims to our children). Second, it is difficult to see how the exemplarist approach provides any more motivation to be moral than does the eudaimonistic approach Zagzebski criticises as lacking motivational pull. Third, exemplarism could implausibly render redundant the question of whether a person of excellent character can ever act wrongly. Moral exemplars might instead be plausibly thought to have both heuristic value in teaching us about virtuous decision-making in various contexts, along with a justificatory role in relation to particular actions, but playing this sort of justificatory role does not entail that moral exemplars must be regarded as basic in Zagzebski's sense (just as rule-utilitarians must invoke rules to justify actions without thereby regarding those rules as basic).

In 'Virtues and Rights in Aristotle's Best Regime', Fred Miller examines whether a clear and robust account of individual rights can be found in Aristotle. Miller argues that there is strong evidence from the Politics and other texts that Aristotle has a conception of rights very much like the modern notion of a claim-right. Miller illuminatingly discusses the connections between Aristotle's view of individual rights and the virtue of justice, and explains why Aristotle believes that "the just constitution … must enable all the citizens to exercise complete virtue simultaneously" (p. 89).

In 'The Virtues and Vices of Virtue Jurisprudence', Antony Duff provides a qualified endorsement of virtue jurisprudence in the context of defences of duress and provocation in criminal law. Given the implausibility of J.F. Stephen's claim that criminal law aims to punish an individual's vice, Duff considers whether recent developments in virtue jurisprudence show that substantive notions of virtue and vice (such as those found in Aristotle's ethics) might nevertheless play a useful role in our understanding of criminal law. Duff reminds us that appeals to a hypothetical 'reasonable person' play a key role in determining criminal liability within English law, and he demonstrates how successful defences of duress and provocation rely on conceptions of reasonable fear and anger that can be usefully analysed by reference to Aristotle's account of a virtuous person. The defendant's fear and the action it prompted must be shown to be reasonable and not excessive responses to the duress, and regarding provocation, it must have been reasonable for the defendant to feel strong anger and to express this with physical violence in the face of the provocation (the defendant did not, after all, display real vice in these circumstances). Duff briefly considers whether his account could be extended to thefts out of parental love and mercy killing under a general defence of 'emotional duress', but realises that such a broadening would raise some very thorny issues. This Aristotelian analysis of duress and provocation is very plausible. However, interpreting defendants who claim duress or provocation as acting from a (somewhat) virtuous motivation might cast some doubt on agent-based accounts of virtue ethics advocated by Slote and others, as the actions performed by the defendant in these circumstances are still wrong, despite their motivation. In any case, Duff rejects the idea that his analysis paves the way for virtue jurisprudence generally, given that the sorts of wrongdoing that the criminal law generally punishes are mostly not sensitive to motive: e.g., assault is still rightly punishable, whether done from cruelty, anger, hatred, cowardice, greed, or even from no vice at all.

Hallvard Fossheim, in 'Habituation as Mimesis', draws on Aristotle's Poetics to explain how we can become good by directing our natural instinct to imitate others towards role models. This instinct to imitate provides a powerful motivating force which is crucial to the success of Aristotelian habituation.

Adam Morton's entertaining chapter on 'Moral Incompetence' uses some real and fictional examples to highlight "the moral failings of decent people". Morton focuses on "the blinding effect of moral conviction", and argues that there is reason to believe that high-principled, morally uncompromising people are more likely than less morally ambitious people to have characters that lead to their bungling. For example, Morton describes how the admirably uncompromising approach to policy taken by former U.S. President Woodrow Wilson actually undermined his goal of having America join the newly-formed League of Nations. Similarly, people in positions of considerable responsibility can find it difficult to be delicate and appropriately sensitive when delivering bad news, and those deficiencies can sometimes foreseeably result in disastrous consequences, especially when people are over-confident in the correctness of their intentions. Morton offers a nice range of diagnoses of various sorts of moral incompetence and he brings out well the complex interplay of capacities that go to make up moral sensitivity. This could be construed as an attack on virtue ethics, but Morton doesn't explicitly pitch the argument in this way. Indeed, getting things right could itself be seen as an important part of the virtue of practical wisdom.

Related concerns are discussed by Timothy Chappell, in 'The Variety of Life and the Unity of Practical Wisdom'. Chappell asks why we should think there is a single virtue of practical wisdom, if it is simply the disposition to get things right in action. Chappell's contrast here between phronesis and other, unitary, virtues might seem overdrawn -- it could be suggested that other virtues are not as singular as often thought: see for example, Michael Stocker (1990) on courage and plural values. Chappell offers "a substantive account of practical wisdom", and gives some good reasons for querying its singularity. Of course, it is well known that phronesis is different in character from other virtues. Aristotle himself (NE 1141b9-17 and 1147b4-6) says that phronesis is a higher-order virtue, a sort of universal judgement that animals cannot have. But Chappell offers a novel interpretation of Aristotelian practical wisdom, suggesting that it is not simply a form of perception (à la McDowell), but is rather a form of reasoning about moral matters -- it is "the ability to make appropriate and rational connections between our desire-sets and our belief-sets" (p. 156). This is an attractive account, though it does seem to overemphasise deliberation at the expense of action in Aristotelian practical wisdom.

Paul Russell's 'Moral Sense and Virtue in Hume's Ethics' collects some interesting textual evidence to show how Hume's master virtue of moral reflection, of "surveying ourselves from the general point of view" (p. 169), has much in common with Aristotelian practical wisdom, while Christine Swanton's 'Can Nietzsche be Both an Existentialist and a Virtue Ethicist?' argues that Nietzsche provides a compelling account of the virtues of an existential individual, such as acceptance or self-love, and demonstrates that his core virtue of integrity has much in common with Aristotelian practical wisdom.

In 'Manners, Morals, and Practical Wisdom', Karen Stohr challenges the boundaries of the familiar distinction between ethics and etiquette, by arguing that having genuinely good manners should be considered a virtue in Aristotle's sense, and is an essential component of practical wisdom. Stohr provides some engaging examples from Jane Austen's novels to demonstrate how manners can be seen as "the outward expression of moral character" (p. 189). Quite different literary sources are used by Sandrine Berges, in 'The Hardboiled Detective as Moralist: Ethics in Crime Fiction'. Berges argues that we may learn more about virtue in ordinary life by considering the characteristics of hardboiled detectives in crime novels than we might from the works of Henry James, which focus on the leisured classes. Berges also explains how the character development of the central figures in response to the evils and challenges they must face contains valuable lessons for all of us about developing the virtues.

The final three chapters focus on issues in moral psychology. In '"Like the Bloom on Youths": How Pleasure Completes our Lives', Johan Brännmark argues persuasively that the good of pleasure has a special place amongst any list of plural goods, because of the role it plays in integrating the different components of well-being. Brännmark demonstrates that no matter how much accomplishment a life contains, it is seriously deficient if the agent does not take pleasure in those achievements: "human well-being is composed both of biographical goods and also of appreciative goods … [and] the central appreciative good is pleasure as enjoyment" (p. 235). 'Mixed Determinates: Pleasure, Good, and Truth' is a scholarly discussion by Theodore Scaltsas of why Aristotle believes that conflict of a certain sort "is unavoidable in the life of the most virtuous individual" (p. 252). The excellence of courage, for example, is not possible without some pain or fear. Talbot Brewer, in 'Three Dogmas of Desire', challenges the assumptions that desires must be propositional attitudes, that desires involve a distinctive disposition to make the world fit with their constituent propositions, and that actions can always be explained as resulting from certain belief-desire pairs.

Some of the papers are a little sketchy or are condensed from work developed elsewhere, and there is not as much cross-fertilisation between the papers as one would have liked. Also, given that Aristotle saw ethics as by definition a practical business, the collection would have been complemented by some papers focusing on applied virtue ethics (see e.g., Walker and Ivanhoe, 2007). Nevertheless, this is a rich and stimulating collection, which itself exhibits many of the important intellectual and scholarly virtues. It could serve as a useful and contemporary introduction to the field, and would be a particularly valuable resource for graduate students and researchers working on these topics.


G.E.M. Anscombe, 'Modern Moral Philosophy', Philosophy 33, 1958.

Michael Stocker, Plural and Conflicting Values, Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1990.

Rebecca L. Walker and Philip J. Ivanhoe (eds.), Working Virtue: Virtue ethics and contemporary moral problems, New York, Oxford University Press, 2007.