Victims' Stories and the Advancement of Human Rights

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Diana Tietjens Meyers, Victims' Stories and the Advancement of Human Rights, Oxford University Press, 2016, 260pp., $31.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199930401.

Reviewed by Rowan Cruft, University of Stirling


What are the proper roles for victims' accounts of human rights violations? How should those who are not victims respond to victims' stories? How can both victims and non-victim human rights activists permissibly use these stories? In her perceptive review of Diana Tietjens Meyers' powerful book on these topics, Johanna Luttrell notes that 'the strength of Meyers's account is that it begins and ends in experience'.[1] In her 'Introduction', Meyers quotes carefully from Mohamedou Ould Slahi's Guantánamo Diary:

I started to have nausea. My heart was a feather, and I shrank myself so small to hold myself together. I thought about all the kinds of torture I had heard of, and how much I could take tonight. I grew blind, thick cloud built in front of my eyes, I couldn't see anything. I grew deaf . . . All I could hear was indistinct whispers.[2]

Meyers pays close attention both to what Slahi tells the reader -- e.g. about the cognitive lapses and varied emotions caused by human rights abuse, and the 'retained humanity despite human rights abuse' shown, for instance, in Slahi's continuing sociability (Meyers, p. 11, p. 14) -- and to how Slahi tells this story, e.g. through shifts from first- to third-personal perspectives. Experience and its portrayal are Meyers's focus in tackling the philosophical questions she sets herself.

Meyers notes early on that 'there has been ample philosophical discussion of some issues that victims' stories raise -- for example, respect for victims, their standing to speak and credibility, and their need to reconstruct their selfhood and agency' (p. 3). Instead, Meyers's five chapters address the following questions, helpfully laid out in summary form on p. 17:

1. What conceptions of victims are presumed in contemporary human rights discourse? How do these conceptions impede progress in recognising victims and realizing human rights  . . . ?

2. How do conventional narrative templates fail victims of human rights abuse and resist raising novel human rights issues?  . . .

3. How does the interplay between a reader's emotions and a victim's story contribute to interpreting the text, and how can victims' stories ward off disgust and/or moral revulsion?

4. What is empathy, and how can victims frame their stories to overcome empathetic obstacles and promote commitment to human rights?

5. How is it possible to ethically use victims' stories in the service of human rights?  . . .

The paradigm conceptions of human rights victims introduced and criticised in the first main chapter ring depressingly true: Meyers distinguishes a 'pathetic victim paradigm' who is 'innocent of any wrongdoing relevant to their treatment;  . . . utterly helpless in the face of insuperable force; and  . . . subjected  . . . to unspeakable suffering' (p. 32) from a 'heroic victim paradigm' who is 'idealistic and courageous' in 'fac[ing] off against the police power of the state in the name of a just cause', whose agency is 'not morally compromised' (pp 35-36). Victims who cannot be squeezed into one or other of these paradigms are denied their appropriate moral status. One of the most powerful contributions of this book is to isolate and criticise these paradigms, and to argue for their replacement and extension with what Meyers calls the 'burdened agency' model. Meyers argues persuasively that 'it is suspicious that ordinary people are so different from paradigmatic victims  . . .  [T]he innocence criteria in these paradigms are at odds with normal human impurity of motivation' (pp. 56-57). A more realistic and humanistic approach to the idea of the victim, one that allows victims and non-victims to see their commonality or to see each other as genuine peers ('fellow humans'), must abandon the problematic 'pathetic' and 'heroic' paradigms.

In this context, Meyers offers insightful discussions of trafficked sex workers -- who, she notes, would qualify as 'heroic' victims if only our conception of heroism extended to 'struggling to care for your family, even at great personal cost' (p. 44) -- and of death row inmates' status as 'non-heroic prisoners' who (sometimes) fail the 'innocence criterion' (p. 56). Meyers's own 'burdened agency' approach acknowledges the spectrum of ways in which human rights violations -- and the threats of such violations -- burden people's agency, placing them in 'action spaces that are warped by wrongful force, fraud, or coercion' (p. 60). Such burdened agency need be neither heroic nor pathetic; I endorse Meyers's view that it is vitally important to expand out conception of human rights abuse and its victims to encompass such cases. What we have at the moment is a mismatch between our paradigms of victimhood -- and the implicit biases these paradigms foster -- and our legal and moral definitions of human rights victimhood, which absurdly and cruelly leaves some as 'not good enough' victims. Meyers's work here is important, and might be read alongside for example Makau Mutua's complementary critique of the related though different 'savages-victims-saviours' paradigm again found in human rights media and culture.[3]

The second chapter examines a wide range of conceptions of narrative structure and its purpose in human rights stories, including looking in detail at work by Anthony Amsterdam and Jerome Bruner, Hayden White, Elizabeth Spelman, Nora Strejilevich and Jean Hatzfield -- I list these in the order they are discussed. Meyers argues ultimately for a view of the 'moral closure' that victims' stories can achieve in terms of not just the full, emotional, presentation of 'grisly truths', but also the performance of a moral claim or demand: a 'clarion moral appeal'. (p 101),

The third chapter argues for the importance of emotional understanding of victims' stories, and defends Jenefer Robinson's view of the moral significance of narratives -- developed in considering novels -- as applicable to autobiographical victims' stories. Particularly interesting is Meyers's discussion of the 'imaginative resistance' generated when a reader of a victim's story fails to empathise with the narrator's moral interpretation of a scenario. She discusses Ishmael Beah's account of his life as a forced child soldier until he was taken to a rehabilitation centre at age fifteen. Meyers pauses on one incident in Beah's story when -- while ordered to take cocaine and marijuana -- he is part of a troop compelled to injure then bury enemies alive. Meyers quotes extensively from Beah, including the following:

We then rolled each man into his hole and covered him with the wet mud. All of them were frightened, and they tried to get up and out of the hole as we put the dirt back on them, but when they saw the tips of our guns pointed into the hole, they lay back and watched us with their pale sad eyes. They fought under the soil with all their might. I heard them groan underneath as they fought for air. Gradually, they gave up and we walked away. "At least they are buried," one of the soldiers said, and we laughed. I smiled a bit again as we walked back to the fire to warm ourselves.[4]

Meyers writes of her response to this passage: 'All of the sympathy for the young narrator that I had built up as he recounted his travails - his terror in the face of natural and human dangers, his rage at much of what he witnessed, and the hardship that strangers gratuitously inflicted on him -- was shaken by this single paragraph' (p. 120). On the next page, she writes 'My feelings about Beah couldn't settle -- war criminal or victimized child?' Now, I have to confess that I did not share Meyers's full response here. I was shaken by what Beah had done, but, perhaps to my surprise, my sympathies remained with him as well as with his victims; I didn't feel the pull to regard 'war criminal' and 'victimized child' as mutually exclusive. One need not be Socrates to worry that committing awful moral wrongs is distinctively horrific for the wrong-doer. While, for Meyers, Beah's partial culpability, his laughing at this atrocity -- and, perhaps, his consequent failure to fit the 'pathetic victim' paradigm -- prompted imaginative resistance, I did not find myself responding in the same way. By maintaining my sympathy rather than condemning, was I engaging in the kind of voyeuristic 'spiritual bellhopping' identified by Elizabeth Spelman, that Meyers criticises (p. 181)? What Meyers goes on to say immediately after quoting from Beah's narrative is insightful: she highlights how, in the passage quoted, Beah forces the reader to 'imaginatively register how utterly terrified, desolate' the buried men were, and she also highlights how 'Beah does almost nothing to render the soldiers' motives and attitudes intelligible  . . . [their] actions and their sick humour at the expense of their victims are mystifying'; Meyers commends the latter 'absence of detail' as a way of making 'no excuse for the squad's conduct' (p. 126). All of this seems correct to me, my only difference from Meyers being my continuing sympathy (of some form) with Beah as he commits an atrocity. But this was one of several places in the book where I felt my own emotional and felt moral responses to the victims' narratives were rather different from Meyers's.

This is, I suspect, an interesting result of Meyers's committed focus on experience, as noted by Luttrell. Implicit in Meyers's approach (and sometimes explicit, as in her deferral to victims' own judgements about 'the extent of their individual [moral] obligations' to tell their stories (p. 184)) is a commitment to hearing, presenting and using victims' stories on the narrators' own terms, avoiding bringing biased, non-empathetic external perspectives to these activities. But our varied responses to the accounts, as evidenced in my own surprising emotional differences from Meyers, show how hard -- perhaps impossible -- this is to do. We cannot avoid our 'own' terms; the best we can do is to maintain awareness of the biases Meyers highlights, for example, in the paradigms discussed in chapter 1. Against this background, I find Meyers's willingness to reveal her own personal responses, to recount her emotions as she reads others' stories, commendable; in a sense, revealing one's personal responses is essential to the virtues of respectful listening and of use that are outlined later -- in chapter 5.

Before turning to that chapter, we should note that chapter 4 develops a plausible case for the importance of empathy in understanding victims' stories: a case that argues against doubters such as Peter Goldie, and builds on Sonia Kruks's work on embodied empathy, arguing (against Kruks here) for the possibility of empathy sometimes transcending gender boundaries. The chapter includes a powerful, careful reading of A Woman in Berlin.[5]

The final chapter in this concise book looks at the ways victims' stories should and should not be used to promote human rights through aid and research projects, and through justice projects such as restorative justice and asylum systems. The proposals and norms developed here are attractive and important. A theme present at various points in the book is picked up explicitly: the influence of the 'Belief in a Just World' (what Meyers calls the 'BJW' hypothesis) and the resultant victim blaming and derogation this belief engenders. Meyers makes good use of work in empirical psychology on the role of a BJW in, e.g., enabling people to pursue long-term goals (p. 185). I was reminded of similar claims from different areas of the discipline, such as Simone Weil's cognate thought, focused not on justice in 'the world' in abstract, but justice being done to oneself: 'At the bottom of the heart of every human being, from earliest infancy until the tomb, there is something that goes on indomitably expecting, in the teeth of all experience of crimes committed, suffered, and witnessed, that good and not evil will be done to him.'[6] Meyers is, I think, correct to advocate pursuit of 'experiences that are likely to curb the excesses of a rigid BJW' (p. 190), and the practical principles she draws from Virginia Valian, Linda Alcoff and Elizabeth Spelman about listening, about speaking for others, and about the misuses of victims' stories, are morally sensitive and important. Meyers is also strong on the risks of retraumatisation (e.g. pp. 199-200). The final sections of the chapter discuss not just ethical use of such stories by human rights groups, but also wider issues about the dangers of competitive market-type interactions between human rights NGOs.

In sum, this is an unusually wide-ranging book on human rights: well-informed by psychology and theories of the nature of narrative and of philosophy of emotion, focused firmly on experience. It is highly original while building plausibly on the literature. One of its many virtues is the way it prompted further thoughts which it does not address. I already mentioned the issue of personal emotional responses; this, I think, is relevant to questions about victims' stories. On p. 194, Meyers writes, 'aid and research professionals must bear in mind that every victim has a unique, multifaceted, temporally extended story, and they must take precautions to make sure that confining a victim-informant to telling a truncated story or supplying isolated facts will not be psychologically damaging.' I found myself wondering whether there was even some imperative to dialogue, rather than simply listening to a full story, an imperative (in context) to the sharing of stories so that victim and researcher or activist are brought together as participants who have revealed themselves equally. In a sense, Meyers herself exemplifies this with her willingness to discuss her own experienced responses to the stories she examines. But I think that, if dialogue is required, this opens tough questions about moral standing raised by our de- and re-colonising, globalising contexts -- questions that are, I suspect, amongst those Meyers hoped to have set aside as tackled by others elsewhere (p. 3).

A second 'further thought' prompted by this book concerns the very idea of victimhood. The idea of 'rights' is occasionally challenged for how it isolates individuals as those who are wronged when wrongdoing occurs, thereby in some ways sidelining non-victims.[7] Meyers's book does not challenge the very concept of victimhood like this; indeed, the stories discussed rather support the thought that particular humans are correctly identified as having a special 'wronged' status in relation to atrocities. But Meyers's 'burdened agency' conception of victimhood points towards the conclusion that being a victim can come in degrees – while, at the same time, highlighting the special status of those directly suffering atrocities.

A third and final thought concerns Meyers's focus on victims' stories as 'promot[ing] awareness of the paramount urgency of securing human rights' (p. 179). This focus on victims' stories as means for attaining improved conditions 'on the ground' is clearly appropriate, and reflects many victims' own aims for their stories. But I wondered also about the relation between such stories and knowledge of the meaning of human rights and their violation. Even if they did not help with the securing or promotion of human rights, victims' stories might help non-victims (and other victims) understand what, exactly, our shared human rights are, in the sense of understanding what human rights' content is: e.g. understanding what precise duties human rights impose, what conditions human rights require for their bearers.

I hope it is obvious that these last three points are not meant as criticisms, but as indications of the depth of issues raised by Meyers's book. I would like to see this succinct, thought-provoking book read not just by philosophers and those already concerned about the importance and role of the experience of human rights violations, but by lawyers and human rights practitioners -- where the latter, of course, means all of us.

[1] Johanna Luttrell, Review of Diana Tietjens Meyers, Victims’ Stories and the Advancement of Human Rights, in Hypatia Reviews Online 2017.

[2] Mohamedou Ould Slahi, Guantánamo Diary (Canongate, 2015, pp. 77-78), quoted by Meyers on her p. 9,

[3] Makau Mutua, Human Rights: A Political and Cultural Critique (University of Pennsylvania Press, 2002).

[4] Ishmael Beah, A Long Way Gone: Memoirs of a Boy Soldier (Farrar, Straus, and Giroux 2007), pp. 150-1.

[5] Anonymous, A Woman in Berlin: Eight Weeks in the Conquered City, trans. P. Boehm (Henry Holt, 2005).

[6] Simone Weil, ‘Human Personality’ [1943], in Simone Weil: An Anthology (Penguin, 2005), p. 71.

[7] For this idea primarily in the context of sports rather than human rights, see Craig Ihara, ‘Are Individual Rights Necessary? A Confucian Perspective’, in K.-L. Shun and D. B. Wong, eds., Confucian Ethics: A Comparative Study of Self, Autonomy, and Community (Cambridge University Press, 2004).  See also Karl Marx, ‘On the Jewish Question’ [1843], reprinted in D. Mclellan, ed., Karl Marx: Selected Writings, 2nd edn (Oxford University Press, 2000), 46-70.