Viewpoint Relativism: A New Approach to Epistemological Relativism based on the Concept of Points of View

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Antti Hautamäki, Viewpoint Relativism: A New Approach to Epistemological Relativism based on the Concept of Points of View, Michelle Mamane (tr.), Springer, 2020, 210pp., $109.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783030345945.

Reviewed by Markus Seidel, Westfälische Wilhelms-Universität Münster


This book claims to present a new approach to epistemological relativism. Antti Hautamäki calls the position he presents 'viewpoint relativism'. Following the introduction, the book begins with some historical background on relativism. Hautamäki then presents his meta-philosophical background and introduces his conception of a point of view: "A triple P=[S,O,A] is called a point of view if and only if A represents O to S, where S is a subject, O is an object, and A is an aspect of O of P." (p. 43) He then applies this conception to the issues of relativism about truth, knowledge and reality: they are said to be relative to points of view. The final two chapters present his stance in the debates about scientific realism and disagreements.

I'm not going to give a more precise summary of the book in this review. The reason is simple: The book does not live up to universally acknowledged academic standards, in form or content, and I am puzzled as to how it was that Springer published it in their 'Synthese Library' series. In what follows, I will lay out the book's fundamental flaws.

Hautamäki's 'new' viewpoint relativism is basically a version of a very mundane form of perspectivism compatible with absolutism. Let me explain by using his own example of points of view:

The same house has three different descriptions: 1. This house is ugly. 2. This house is for sale. 3. This house is the oldest one on the street. If these are assigned as aspects to describe the house, then (1) presents the aesthetic, (2) the economical and (3) the historical point of view. (p. 44)

So far, so good, but I do not know of any absolutist who would actually dispute this. The statements differ, but nobody would see a disagreement between them. What would a dispute between the hypothetical absolutists the author seems to think of look like? A: "See, this house is the oldest in the street." B: "No, you are wrong, this house is for sale." A: "That cannot be true: Look, the house is at least 100 years old." B: "You are wrong, because I see the 'for sale' sign in front of it." That's not absolutism. No absolutist would deny that it is, of course, possible to give different descriptions of the same object from different points of view so long as they are compatible with each other. Obviously, since ugly houses that are the oldest on the street can be for sale, the author's supposed 'relativism' simply fails to provide an adequate conception of the possibility of faultless disagreement -- something the author himself sees as necessary for relativism (see p. 181). There simply is no faultless disagreement in this case, but different descriptions of the same object depending on the aspects picked out. Hautamäki's 'relativism' consists merely in dissolving disagreements by disambiguating them.

This can also be seen quite clearly in section 8.2.1 entitled "Disagreement based on Points of View". The author, again, uses an example:

let us consider women's equality compared to men. A. Women are equal to men. B. Women are not equal to men. Claims A and B are contradictory, and according to the principle of consistency, only one of them can be true. But if we consider points of view, then both can be true. C. Women are equal to men [in terms of the constitution]. D. Women are not equal to men [in terms of wages]. C and D could both be true. As we know, claims A and B provoke passionate discussions and arguments about the equality of the genders. In terms of the viewpoint theory, we can try to solve these disputes by identifying the points of view that the contradictory claims are often presented from. (p. 184)

I want to make two comments about the example. First, does the author really believe that he solves disputes about gender-equality in the way suggested? He treats statements A and B as elliptical descriptive statements in need of relativization to aspects. But clearly those who dispute about gender-equality need not disagree about how the facts are to be described. They treat the statements A and B as statements with normative force and not simply as descriptions. Imagine a feminist. Surely, the feminist can accept statement D: as a matter of fact, men and women are not equal with respect to wages. In fact, accepting D (and noting other instances of the unfair treatment of women) is the very basis of most feminists' commitment. But s/he will insist that the pay gap between men and women is something we should overcome. Why? Well, because the feminist will insist that a woman's work, time, and potential are worth the same as a man's, such that the pay gap is unjust. Interestingly, the same goes for the anti-feminist. S/he might well accept (as does the feminist) that in terms of the constitution women are equal to men. But (unlike the feminist) s/he might insist that it is simply a mistake for the constitution to grant equal rights. Why? Well, because the anti-feminist insists that there are genuine differences between women and men.

A real relativist's solution to such a dispute would be to relativize the normative force of the statements A and B to points of view, whereas the absolutist would disagree and maintain that only one of the statements can be (normatively) right. The first flaw of the example is that Hautamäki treats the dispute about gender-equality solely as a dispute about facts, but it also -- obviously, I think -- is always at heart a dispute about values. The second problem with the example is that even if we were to accept such a solution to the dispute, the solution is not in fact based on allowing for faultless disagreement. It is the sort of solution any sane absolutist would accept: "Actually, A and B only seemed to constitute a case of faultless disagreement, but in fact what the disputants meant to say is captured by statements C and D, respectively. There is no faultless disagreement at all; the disputants were talking past each other." Accordingly, the second problem with the example is that it merely establishes mundane perspectivism, which is quite compatible with absolutism.

One might be tempted to say here that the author simply has a definition of 'relativism' that differs from the definition used by nearly all other participants in the debate. Unfortunately, even this option is not open to us. To see this, consider another example. Hautamäki writes:

For the sake of example, let us assume that a patient has an infection that must be treated. The doctor interprets the infection to be caused by bacteria, and therefore prescribes the patient a course of antibiotics. . . . Meanwhile, if it were a member of an ancient Inca tribe who had the infection, the shaman might have interpreted the infection to be caused by evil spirits. The treatments following this might include casting spells, exorcism etc. . . . However, the example cannot be interpreted to mean that the point of view of the shaman is wrong; it is simply very inadequate and problematic when applied to maintaining health by our criteria. (p. 62)

This statement is surely not easily accepted by absolutists. They would maintain that given that the patient "has an infection that must be treated" (ibid.), the question of whether the shaman's point of view is adequate or not is not relativized "to maintaining health by our criteria" (ibid.). Instead, the absolutist will say that the question of whether the treatment by the doctor or the shaman cures the infection can be answered independently of a point of view -- it depends on whether the infection is cured or not. Thus, in this case, it seems Hautamäki presents a genuine relativistic position in maintaining that the doctor and the shaman can faultlessly disagree about the cure: the doctor's as well as the shaman's points of view are inadequate only "when applied to maintaining health by [the other's] criteria" (ibid.). (Note: If we say that the shaman means by 'health' something quite fundamentally different than we do, we are back with misunderstanding and not faultless disagreement.)

Therefore, the author's position seems more than unclear: Is it a mundane form of perspectivist absolutism that dissolves faultless disagreements by disambiguation? Or is it a genuine form of relativism that allows for faultless disagreement between, for example, the shaman and the doctor with respect to the proper treatment of infections?

That Hautamäki's defended position is obscure is an example of a more fundamental lack of philosophical scholarship throughout the book. He presents his own opinion without even trying to discuss potential counterarguments -- despite openly acknowledging that "as its method, philosophy uses argumentative discussion" (p. 13). Let me illustrate by investigating Hautamäki's ideas on 'core rationality'. He writes: "I renounce the strong relativism of rationality. . . . Renouncing strong relativism does not exclude that rationality can be understood in different ways in different fields of science and in different cultures. We can still find shared notions." (p. 16) The author aims to spell out "very basic rules and features of rationality" (ibid.). Such "core rationality . . . provides a common structure or foundation" (ibid.). Amongst the principles of core rationality is: "Principle of deduction: If a statement p can be deductively inferred from the premises and if we accept them, then we have to accept p, too." (p. 21) Hautamäki considers core rationality "a prerequisite of rational discussion" (p. 23). However, "While accepting core rationality as the prerequisite of philosophical discussion, I would still not go as far as to claim this kind of rationality is universal" (ibid.). He thinks that "Core rationality is not global rationality, but a kind of normativity that enables rational discussion. It can be considered meta-rationality, through which different local rational principles can be compared." (p. 24) This meta-rationality is then said to provide

a common framework for scientific discussion. No matter which special methods are used, we require consistency, logical reasoning and justification from science. In this sense, core rationality . . . can be seen as the core of the scientific method . . . . Other cultures that acquire knowledge may use different principles and criteria of rationality. Core rationality is, at least, rationality for us, the practitioners of Western science and philosophy. (ibid.)

Hautamäki does not seem to see that his statements here are not easily reconcilable, and does not provide the reader with an explanation of how they are to be reconciled. Let me explain by drawing on a much-discussed example -- that of the Azande. (Hautamäki should be familiar with the example since it plays a prominent role, e.g., in Boghossian's book.) Although I endorse Timm Triplett's argument on the issue (1988), let us assume for the sake of argument that David Bloor (1991) is right that the Azande do not subscribe to Western logic in that they reject Modus Ponens. If this were true, the Azande would be a case of another culture which uses "different principles and criteria of rationality" (p. 24), since they do not subscribe to the author's principle of deduction. Core rationality may, as Hautamäki claims, be the epitome of rationality for us practitioners of Western science, but (given Bloor's assumption) it is not rationality for the Azande; hence core rationality is not universal. But then how can Hautamäki still claim that core rationality is supposed to be a kind of meta-rationality "through which different local rational principles can be compared" (p. 24)? How can we have the kind of "normativity that enables rational discussion" (p. 24) if the Azande do not subscribe to core rationality? Are the Azande irrational since they do not subscribe to the principle of deduction that is "a prerequisite of rational discussion" (p. 23)? It seems as if Hautamäki needs to claim this -- otherwise I do not understand what the words 'enable' and 'prerequisite' are supposed to mean here. Alas, Hautamäki cannot easily claim that the Azande are irrational, because -- as he claims -- "Other cultures . . . may use different principles and criteria of rationality. Core rationality is, at least, rationality for us, the practitioners of Western science and philosophy." (p. 24). Thus, it seems that he does not want the Azande to be judged by our criteria of rationality: they have different criteria according to which they might be judged to be rational.

My agenda here is not to argue that a relativist solution to such problems is not feasible. Perhaps there is a way to reconcile the conflicting statements. Rather, what worries me is that Hautamäki doesn't even see the need to spell out how he aims to reconcile the statements. He demonstrates no awareness of potential problems -- and the just mentioned problem with Azande rationality is a widely acknowledged key problem in discussions about cognitive relativism. Hautamäki's assertion that his version of relativism can reconcile the idea of core rationality with the advocation of divergent standards of rationality is moot, given his blindness to potential tensions between such ideas. Let me reformulate the problem. Probably everybody in the debate would prefer to be a relativistic absolutist in that s/he aims to integrate the plausible intuitions of both camps. I, for example, also aim to integrate tolerance about differing beliefs with the idea that we all live in one world that the beliefs are about. The difficult -- and interesting -- task is to show just how that can be done. And engaging with that task is philosophy; just having opinions and intuitions in philosophical debates and simply claiming that they can be consistently held is not.

Throughout the book, Hautamäki takes stances that amount to no more than assertions (since presented without supporting philosophical argument) on a wide range of highly controversial issues (feminist epistemology, natural kinds, and the current political situation of the 'post-truth era', among others). He also misrepresents basic philosophical tools, e.g., confusing the law of excluded middle with the principle of bivalence (p. 23) and not respecting the use-mention distinction even when discussing Frege's Morning-Star-Evening-Star example (p. 28).

How is it possible that a book with such flaws appears in a respected series from an established academic publisher? This may be an instance of a large, corporate publishing house being unable or unwilling to help maintain academic standards, to focus on profit rather than quality. I know that I am not alone in judging that corporate publishers are indeed moving in that direction (see, for example, the declaration by Cambridge philosopher, Hasok Chang).


Bloor, D. 1991: Knowledge and Social Imagery. The University of Chicago Press.

Triplett, T. 1988: "Azande Logic Versus Western Logic?", in The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 39/3, pp. 361-366.