Violence and Phenomenology

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James Dodd, Violence and Phenomenology, Routledge, 2009, 179pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415800167.

Reviewed by Peg Birmingham, DePaul University


James Dodd's Violence and Phenomenology begins by considering whether we have become the "dupes of violence." The danger of being duped by violence, he argues, is particularly grave in the violence of war because in the form of war especially we expect both too much and too little. We expect too much when violence is used to shore up state authority or to spread spheres of power, and we expect too little when we think that violence will eventually "whither away due either to the weight of our moral vigilance or the effectiveness of the political, legal, social, or ethical instruments that we employ in the hope of avoiding the destruction of war" (1). Dodd suggests that becoming the dupes of violence, by either expecting too much or too little from it, is rooted in an unacknowledged tension or opposition between a purely instrumental conception of violence and a conception of violence as uniquely constitutive of its own meaning or sense. In other words, we are easily duped by violence because we do not grasp that violence is always more than simply instrumental, used as a means to accomplish some end; it is at the same time constitutive of the meaning or sense of human existence which, he argues, makes violence a philosophical problem of the first order.

Violence is also a philosophical problem because from its beginnings philosophy has been bound up with the question of war. By this Dodd does not simply mean that Plato's philosophy arises out of the catastrophe of the Peloponnesian Wars or that Hobbes's thought is born of the English Civil Wars (6). Eather, he claims that philosophy's central concerns with freedom and the nature of the self emerge from a reflection on how we fight: "There is something fundamental about free being that finds its way into expression through the peculiar intensification of the experience of war" (9). Both war and philosophy for him are extreme circumstances that reveal the self:

For if both of these experiences -- the assumption of risk, of standing together in danger that is basic to the combat experience, and the struggle with the question of the self, in dialogue standing together to face the risk of an uncertain result -- manifestly define in basic ways the primordial experience of freedom, then is there not the possibility that, on some fundamental level, philosophy and war are the same event? (10)

The risks and uncertainty of waging war and the risks and uncertainty of rational free argument are for Dodd one and the same, thereby putting philosophy and war on the same footing. Thus, the philosophical examination of violence is at the same time self-examination.

Dodd turns to phenomenology to navigate the tension between understanding violence as either instrumental or constitutive of sense because of phenomenology's "conviction that all genuine philosophical problems are problems of sense and meaning" (15). His turn to phenomenology, however, is more than simply the use of a method. With chapters on Clausewitz and Schmitt, Arendt and Sartre, Jünger and Heidegger, and, finally, Patočka, Dodd does not limit himself to a phenomenology of violence. Instead, he shows how phenomenology itself emerges out of the violence of the twentieth century, a century that Patočka calls "the century of war." In other words, while it is true that for Dodd phenomenology is the philosophical method best suited for grappling with the sense of violence, nevertheless, the importance of his analysis lies in its examination of how various phenomenological understandings of the self, freedom, possibility, history, and responsibility emerge from out of the violence of war.

Dodd begins, however, not with phenomenology, but instead with Clausewitz's claim that "war is politics by other means," which for him affirms the "stupidity of violence principle," a principle that claims violence is instrumental, a means to an end; as such, it is blind, senseless, and stupid. For Clausewitz, war has its own grammar but not its own logic, and therefore the violence of war always refers to something outside of itself for its meaning or sense (25). Dodd claims that Clausewitz is not entirely consistent, arguing that he vacillates between an understanding of violence as instrumental and as constitutive of an existential sense. In other words, Clausewitz understands violence as necessary for the existence of the political space itself:

Thus war is not simply a means to a given end projected by the political subject, but war is also a 'means' for political subjectivity as such, in the sense of a constitutive medium of its realization; not to be able to fight a war in the face of an attack, or not being able to discover that possibility within itself, is tantamount to ceasing to exist as a polity (31).

Dodd argues that:

[If Clausewitz's concrete analysis of war is an attempt to understand] how and why it is that we move from peace to war and then back to a modified peace, then we cannot, ultimately, eliminate either the sense of the pure instrumentality of war, nor its pure existentiality; for in fact, both play a role for Clausewitz in the determination of how and why we fight (31, italics in original).

For Dodd, Schmitt is the thinker par excellence of the existential sense of the violence of war. Indeed, there is for Schmitt no sense for war other than its existential sense since war is the affirmation of the political:

Thus war, the immediate demand to sacrifice and to kill, cannot for Schmitt meaningfully take any other form than the decision that brings the political entity into existence, nor can the decision take any other form than an engagement with the possibility of the extreme case. There can be no other sense for war than its existential sense (38, italics in original).

Schmitt's challenge for Dodd is that he has not resolved the tension in Clausewitz between an instrumental and an existential violence:

The violence of war may be serious, but that is only because in war we are pursuing serious things with violence. And what is more, even when existence, above all political existence, is at stake in war, this does not in any way detract from the instrumental character of violence, even if it may appear to do so (45, italics in original).

In what follows, Dodd takes up the tension or opposition between instrumental and existential violence in the respective thought of Arendt, Sartre, Fanon, Jünger, Heidegger, and Patočka. Bringing Arendt and Sartre together, Dodd questions whether Arendt is entirely correct when arguing that violence is merely instrumental, incapable of generating anything new in the world. His analysis of Sartre's Notebooks for an Ethics calls Arendt into question, asking whether in fact violence, especially revolutionary violence (and here Dodd brings Fanon into the discussion), can be the basis of a new beginning. His discussion of Jünger and Heidegger is especially rich and original. Here Dodd brilliantly links the problem of nihilism to the question of violence, taking seriously the image of the line in the work of both thinkers and showing how both connect this image to the catastrophe of the front lines of the trenches. Reading Jünger, Dodd asks whether Jünger is correct to argue that violence allows us to move beyond the front lines of nihilism. Does the catastrophe of war allow for something other than nihilism? Dodd shows the stakes involved with the answer. If we agree with Jünger that catastrophic violence catapults us over the line of nihilism toward something affirmative, then everything should be done to do just that. But, if the human being is the line, on the line, as Heidegger argues, then the idea of crossing over the line by some catastrophic event is misguided. The catastrophic has not allowed for the turning away from nothingness and the emergence of the possible (106).

Although Dodd suggests that Heidegger offers more in thinking of violence as instrumental rather than constitutive of new possibilities, he ultimately claims that Heidegger may be closer to Jünger than it appears at first glance due to his notion of an "originary violence," which suggests that we "have a need for catastrophes in order to be shaken out of the stupor of the normalcy of self-destruction" (108). Dodd's own position on the matter is puzzling. On the one hand, he critiques Jünger and Heidegger on the question of "originary violence" and the inevitability of catastrophe, yet, on the other hand, he seems to agree entirely:

But it is nevertheless the case that, if we are to understand the essence of the human being, we cannot avoid speaking of a catastrophe, and with that the inscription in the event of appropriation of a figure of violence that promises to be beyond the control of nihilism (108).

Is Dodd agreeing that there is originary violence? Is the essence of the human being catastrophic? He does not develop his argument.

While his analysis of each of the aforementioned thinkers is nuanced, focused, and richly illuminating, Dodd's inability to take a position emerges as a central difficulty of the book. This difficulty is best seen by turning to the conclusion, where he takes up six problems of violence that emerge in the course of his analysis and which he argues are linked by "the importance of the opposition or tension between a purely instrumental conception of violence, and a conception of violence as uniquely constitutive of its own meaning, or sense" (134).

The first problem Dodd addresses is whether violence is necessary for the emergence of possibility. To say "yes" is to agree that violence is constitutive of meaning or sense. Schmitt and Patočka are the two figures who for Dodd are most committed to this view. Schmitt's friend/enemy distinction, he argues, emerges out of an understanding of violence as the inherent possibility of the political, while for Patočka violence as the disruption of the everyday allows for the appearance of authentic possibilities of existence. Dodd challenges both views. Confronting Patočka, he asks why we should begin with violence in order to discover an authentic life. Is not rather the opposite the case, namely "that we cannot begin with violence, that there is no possible conception of 'original violence' that would not also risk a fundamental distortion of the meaning of human freedom?" (137, italics in original) Contra Patočka, it seems as if Dodd will develop his position that violence destroys the possibility of human freedom and therefore the possibility of the political; however, he does not pursue or develop the question further.

Instead, he moves on to a second problem, namely, that a sense of selfhood seems to emerge only in violence, specifically the violence of self-defense. Following Clausewitz, Dodd claims that all self-defense is rooted in the use of force and, more importantly, that the sense of self emerges in this defense. Violence then is constitutive for the sense of the self. Dodd seems to take Clausewitz's argument at face value, although it seems to me that it is possible to think of non-violent ways of self-defense. Here we need only to recall Plato's Apology. There is nothing of force in Socrates' defense in response to the three charges against him. While Dodd does not consider non-violent ways of self-defense, he does seem to argue contra Schmitt that while a sense of self emerges out of violence, violence seems to distort this sense: "it is impossible to decide whether what violence shows us of ourselves … is something that can be taken back to a normal state of things, or whether all we have in our hands is merely an illusion" (138). Indeed, Dodd goes further, pointing out the short-sightedness of such a position:

Philosophically, the problem is how human beings grapple with the question of their possibility; if we are to learn anything from violence in this respect, it can only be after we have avoided reducing human questionability to the empty form of violence and the illusions it generates. If we accept "danger" as constitutive of our being together as a polity, if all our discussions about "who we are" begin with the possibility of violence, we will only end up with violence as an idée fixe, a dumb fascination with our capacity to turn things upside down; we will see nothing but violence sitting in the middle of our common life (140).

And yet here too Dodd does not develop his own position, turning back to Schmitt and asking of the "original sources" of violence if these sources do not lie in the self and its possibilities.

Dodd next turns to the problem of the legacy of violence, a problem which first emerged in his reading of Sartre's "practico-inert." Dodd maintains that the legacy of violence seems to fall into the "stupidity of violence" claim insofar as it reveals nothing in itself but must be taken up aesthetically, politically, socially, or economically. Yet the legacy of violence, and here he refers explicitly to Fanon, seems to provide the motivation for resistance. Here again Dodd's position is ambiguous. He seems to want to claim that violence provides the motivation for resistance, yet he also suggests that this is an illusion as "the inertia of violence amounts to a reticence of meaning, which in turn renders its relation to motivation very complex" (143). He suggests that to respond to violence by again lifting the "world off its hinges" only reveals the futility of thinking that the outcome will be different this time around. While the legacy of violence might point to an originary violence, he argues that it ought not to motivate us now:

Violence in its essence is to strike against something that has already eluded one's grasp; but for us, the latecomers, the beneficiaries of its legacy, this is not an original experience at all, but an experience in which or for which such a strike, or the lifting of the world off its hinges, has always already taken place. When it comes to violence, we are in effect addicts, struggling with the temptation to once again lift things off their hinges, to break our already broken world, and, like all addicts, we tend to expect that somehow the outcome will this time be different (143).

Dodd suggests that even if violence is originary, it makes no difference in terms of the violent legacy we now inhabit. For him, all violence is a rejection of the world and to respond to the legacy of violence with more violence is futile, the only outcome being to continue to "lift the world off its hinges." And yet Dodd concludes the discussion by again equivocating. Seemingly rejecting the use of violence to respond to violence, Dodd ultimately takes back what he just gave, asking, "But if the world is burdened by the legacies of violence, then how can one not reject it -- and with that open oneself to the madness of an unjustified right to violence?" (144) To this all-important question, he gives no response.

Dodd then turns to the problem of responsibility and violence, asking whether a developed concept of responsibility might help in facing the legacy of violence. He takes up Patočka's call for the "solidarity of the shaken," a solidarity that for Patočka is soldered in the experience of war. Dodd's analysis is extremely rich and adds much to the current literature on Patočka's thought, especially his treatment of Patočka's notion of responsibility rooted as it is in demonic sacrifice. Dodd is skeptical of Patočka's position, however, turning to Fanon who is

sharply critical of the dependency that the colonized have on such activities -- the permissiveness of the circle, of the orgiastic itself, represents for him an enactment of violence that is empty and useless for raising the consciousness of the colonized for the struggle against the colonizers (145-146).

Here again Dodd does not take a position. Instead of developing a notion of responsibility rooted in Fanon's rejection of demonic sacrifice, he rephrases Patočka's challenge:

we expect too little of violence if we do not appreciate the deep potential for disturbance it brings to our lives, or can bring; more, we expect too little, if we fail to appreciate the possibilities of what it sets into motion. This is not an argument for embracing violence … But it is a call to take seriously the experience of the extreme as an originary source of all meaning (147).

Again the reader is left wondering just where Dodd stands. On the one hand he is not presenting an argument for embracing violence; on the other hand, he calls for taking it seriously as the "originary source of all meaning." If the latter is true, then why not embrace violence?

This leads Dodd to consider the problem animating the entire discussion, namely, whether violence has a sense. Does an activity that disrupts the world, in fact, rips it off its hinges, possess a meaning? Initially, Dodd suggests that it does. Violence is not merely negative; it can also affirm an idea, an event, or a set of political goals. At the same time, following Sartre, Dodd argues that the subjective dimension of violence is always experienced as a disruption of time. Is it possible, he asks, to find meaning in this disruption? Seemingly answering in the negative, Dodd calls into question Patočka's claim that in this disruption and dissolution of experience the self becomes manifest; but he takes no position, merely stating at the end of this section, "Either way, the essential point is that violence becomes an acute problem for a philosophy that seeks to realize itself in the form of a reflection on a subjectivity that articulates the sense of things" (149). In the penultimate section, grappling with his central question, namely, whether violence is meaningful, Dodd says only that for phenomenology violence is an "acute problem." Certainly we can expect more from a book titled Violence and Phenomenology.

Finally, taking the above five problems together, Dodd asks whether the problem of violence is the problem of evil. Evil, he reminds us, has been traditionally understood as "a rupture with the coherence of the sense of things, with the conditions for meaningfulness itself" (150). His analysis argues that violence too is disruptive and disfiguring. However, he goes on to argue that violence cannot be conflated with evil. We can ask why evil exists, but we cannot ask the same question of violence. Moreover, we judge evil in ways that we do not judge violence: "Whereas we hold violence in contempt, evil we abhor, judge, and condemn" (152). Is this true? Do not at least some of us condemn the violence of the invasion of Iraq and the killing of thousands of civilians even if we do not call it evil? And some of us surely would. Is violence always exhilarating in ways that evil is not, as Dodd suggests? Is it not also horrifying as Adriana Cavarero argues in her book Horrorism, especially if one takes the victim's point of view? Further still, is it so easy to hold apart violence and evil? Dodd himself calls into question his all too neat distinction between violence and evil, pointing out that "the problems of evil and violence seem to converge" (152). He goes on to claim that perhaps what ultimately confronts us is the antimony of the "evil of violence," insofar as "to call violence itself evil would perhaps expect too much from violence, while to claim that it is not evil would expect too little" (153).

Dodd concludes by returning to Clausewitz and the violence of war. Despite the attempts of just war theories to define the permissible and the forbidden in acts of war, rational argument, he argues, falls short, unable to grasp adequately the violence unleashed upon the world. Thus, for Dodd, violence remains a philosophical problem, "for none of our answers, and there are many more than what we have been able to consider here, eradicates the fundamental problematicity of violence, safely shielding us from becoming its dupes" (153). While I am sympathetic to the ways in which violence, blindly instrumental or constitutive of sense, resists our best efforts to understand it fully, nevertheless, it seems that we can say more without becoming its dupes. Indeed, to avoid being dupes of violence, it seems to me that we must go beyond the logic of expecting "too much and too little" which at the conclusion of Dodd's book seems to leave us understanding nothing much at all. If the continual "ripping of the world off its hinges" is futile, leading only to further destruction, then it seems imperative that more needs to be said than simply that we must resist when faced with violence. Certainly. But what would that response look like? And finally, if, as Dodd claims, philosophy, including phenomenology, emerges out of violence in the form of war, is it not then the case that we must turn elsewhere for a response to both phenomenology and violence? The political, perhaps?