Virtue and Law in Plato and Beyond

Placeholder book cover

Julia Annas, Virtue and Law in Plato and Beyond, Oxford University Press, 2017, 234pp., $45.00, ISBN 9780198755746.

Reviewed by Chris Bobonich, Stanford University


This superb book clearly displays Annas' characteristic keen sense of what the important philosophical problems are and her willingness to offer bold, new interpretations. Her central question here is how the law can develop and sustain genuine virtue in the citizens to whom it applies. She pursues these questions by examining Plato's Republic in the initial chapter, the Laws in the next four, and Cicero and Philo each in one chapter.

The Republic chapter rightly emphasizes law's pervasiveness in Kallipolis. Annas holds that it is "because of the excellence of [Kallipolis'] laws that people brought up to obey them develop virtue rather than other traits" (23). All citizens, including the rulers, are brought up to be "firmly law-abiding." For all citizens, having the right character is in part to be firmly law-abiding and part of obedience to law is a commitment to sustain the educational system it establishes which extends the rulers' virtues.

Annas' discussion of the Republic is brief and, I think, leaves some unclarities. Annas clearly holds that philosophers' ethical character and that of the lower two classes differ greatly. The philosopher-rulers understand what virtue and happiness really are and thus the law's aim which is the city's greatest happiness (Rep. 420B). It is harder to discern her view of the auxiliaries' and the producers' characters. She acknowledges a significant difference between the average citizen of Kallipolis and of Magnesia (the city of the Laws) and this provides some information about Kallipolis' lower classes. In Magnesia

considerably more [is demanded] of [the average citizen] than is demanded of the producing class in the Republic, who have to obey, strictly, the laws expertly laid down by the rulers, but without the requirement that they themselves understand the reasoning behind them. (151)

All that the producers understand are "their own interests and aims" (24) which is not to suggest that they correctly understand even the real value of the goals that they pursue. They "merely live by laws but cannot understand them and the ideals that they are intended to promote" (159). They are "focused on the satisfaction of their own desires, and on the means to this, namely money" (10).

Thus, it seems reasonable to conclude that the average Magnesian citizen's character is significantly better than that of the producers, but we do not learn exactly how defective the producers' character is. Annas avoids discussing the auxiliaries, but appears to class them with the producers as simply lacking such understanding (159). This is consistent with her fundamental characterization of the auxiliaries as simply focused on "honour and status" (10). This is significant since, insofar as the lower classes' characters do not include a grasp of good reasons for action and thus of correct values, they will tend to be mere habits of obedience rather than genuine virtues. It thus seems that obedience to the law for the vast majority of Kallipolis' citizens does not foster genuine virtue (even if it is better or less bad than disobedience) and that what does the work of developing genuine virtue is the rulers' philosophical education. This is in tension with Annas' remark that Plato "takes for granted the mutual sustaining, in Kallipolis, of law and the development of virtuous character" (22).

Annas' discussion of the Laws comprises the book's core. This material is rich and contains much that deserves more extended treatment than is possible here. I shall examine some subsidiary points and then discuss what I think is the book's central unresolved tension.

(1) With respect to happiness and virtue in the Laws, Annas points to two sets of passages (105-9): several holding that there are goods other than virtue but that these goods only become good for their possessor when she is virtuous (631BD, 660E-662C) and one that Annas sees as asserting that virtue is sufficient for happiness (660E2-5) which she takes as equivalent to the Stoic thesis that happiness just is virtue. These passages' inconsistency, however, is understandable (108): since Plato was the first to develop the Stoic position, he was prone to state it confusedly.

It is not, however, inherently attractive to attribute to an author a contradiction that he has the conceptual resources to resolve. (And it seems plausible that Plato can distinguish virtue's being a necessary condition of other goods benefitting their possessor from the idea that virtue is the only good.) In this case, the passage (660E2-5) that Annas finds asserting virtue's sufficiency for happiness only says that a virtuous person can be happy while lacking many other goods; it does not say that she can be happy possessing only virtue. So there seems to be no contradiction to explain. Further, even if the passage were read to assert sufficiency, we can reconcile all the passages. If happiness is degreed (cf. 662D-663A, 734CE, and 742E-743E), then virtue might be sufficient for meeting the threshold for happiness, but since other goods when possessed by the virtuous person really are good for her, they can make her happier.

(2) Annas often proceeds by selectively summarizing parts of the Laws with commentary. Given the Laws' unfamiliarity, this is very helpful, and Annas' comments are insightful and challenging. There are, however, some lapses. For example, Annas sees (as many do) the Athenian's interlocutors, Kleinias (a Cretan) and Megillus (a Spartan), as intellectually limited, but (from their societies' perspective) ethically impeccable, conservative old gentlemen. Indeed, she claims that they accept the Athenian's view that virtue is necessary for happiness (73, 78). This overlooks, however, Kleinias' insistence that a person having "only injustice and hubris" (661E2), and lacking all the virtues except courage, lives a shameful but happy life if he has enough other goods (661D-662C). Such a view is, for Plato, a serious ethical failing and is certainly far worse than would be expected from average Magnesians. Their defectiveness would be a minor point, except that Annas thinks that theologically the ordinary Magnesian remains at Kleinias' and Megillus' level (123-4). As we shall see, as in this case, that view underestimates the former.

(3) A big book may be a big evil, but Annas' brevity sometimes leaves her position unclear. In discussing the preambles to the laws, Annas notes that Book 10's lengthy preamble to the impiety law is exceptional not merely in extent, but in argumentative rigor. She adds that Kleinias' and Megillus' inability to follow this argument "makes it clear . . . that in Magnesia the understanding of certain laws at least cannot easily be made available to everyone, but has to be provided on a need-to-know basis" (94). This suggests that Book 10's argument is not available to all the citizens, but only to members of the Nocturnal Council to use in persuading the impiety law's violators.

But such a view is implausible. First, the Athenian never says that Book 10's argument has a restricted audience and at its end explicitly calls it "the preamble" to the impiety law (907D1-2). If the Athenian only intended this material for the Nocturnal Council, there would be no need to attach it as a preamble to the impiety law. It could, like the information from the city's foreign observers which is restricted, simply be assigned to the Council. Second, in the methodological passages concerning the preambles (719E-724A, 857B-861C), they are clearly intended for all the citizens and there is no hint anywhere in the Laws that some have a restricted audience. Third, if the impiety law's preamble is restricted to the Council, there would be no publicly available preamble to this fundamental law (887B8-C2). Fourth, Kleinias' and Megillus' inability to follow the argument does not show that the average Magnesian could not have some appreciation of it. Magnesia's citizens are considerably better educated than Kleinias and Megillus: as Annas notes, "everyone in Magnesia will . . . learn quite advanced mathematics" (94-5). Finally, Kleinias explicitly addresses the worry about the ordinary Magnesian's ability in a passage that clearly envisages that the Book 10 argument is available to all citizens including the intellectually slower. Having the preambles, especially the Book 10 one, available in writing is valuable because "even if they are hard to listen to initially, that is nothing to be feared, since even the slow learner can come back and examine them frequently" (891A2-4).[1]

I turn now to what I take to be the main tension in Annas' account. The laws, especially in Magnesia, are supposed to foster the citizens' virtue. But law by its nature compels behavior by its sanction. Thus, one worry is that the reason law seems to offer for obedience (avoidance of the sanction) is not the reason that should move virtuous people. Further, the specification of certain behavior does not constitute an explanation of the reasons behind the law which should be part of the virtuous person's motivation. (The laws might require education, but then it is that education that fosters the appropriate understanding and motivation.)

Virtue's intellectual component is developed by the citizens' education, the laws' preambles, and other Magnesian cultural practices (e.g. choral performances). Annas often sounds optimistic about the citizens' attainments: they "must have the virtues [emphasis in original], not mere habits of conforming to laws and going along with culture" (69), they will "appreciate good reason" (97) for obeying the laws, the members of the Nocturnal Council "will understand the point of the laws in greater depth than the other citizens, but this should be a matter of degree rather than of kind" (146), and the citizens will have "a rational appreciation of the workings of the cosmos" (194).

On the other hand, she argues that some features of the city, e.g., its restriction of free inquiry, tend to produce less intellectually advanced dispositions in most citizens. The preambles which the methodological passages introducing them present as a form of intellectually sophisticated (albeit non-philosophic) rational activity turn out "typically" not to offer any "rational explanation" (95). (This is why it is important for Annas that Book 10's preamble only be available to a few.) The preambles simply present the ideals underlying the laws and encourage the citizens to adopt them by "praise and blame, and by the ethical force of Magnesian social pressure generally" (102). Annas, like many who view the preambles' rationality negatively, offers no explanation for the mismatch between the methodological passages' rationale for them and what she takes to be their actuality.[2] But the less impressive the average citizen's character, the less is law's power to lead people to genuine virtue and the greater must be one's reliance on an education transcending the laws.

It is hard, I think, to integrate Annas' positive and negative remarks within a single account. Why bother to provide an advanced mathematical education intending that the citizens have a "rational appreciation" of the cosmos, when the preambles do not offer rational explanations and the Book 10 theology which gives an account of the cosmos' rationality is forbidden to almost all Magnesians? Why think that praising and blaming certain actions and ends will produce an understanding of these ends and the proper motivation for pursuing them, i.e. one that values virtue for its own sake and not because it is honorable?

Other commentators have noticed these tensions and there have been a variety of responses to them.

(1) We might take the methodological passages seriously and as consistent with the Book 10 prelude and the citizens' astronomical and mathematical education. This will involve giving some account of ordinary citizens' education and resultant disposition that shows why, despite falling short of philosophical standards, they count as rational. Such interpretations must also explain the Laws' apparently inconsistent features, e.g. the presence of preludes that do engage in non-rational ways of changing belief.

(2) We might accept that the preambles and the citizens' education work primarily by praise and blame and appeals to honor. Such interpretations then should say whether such education and persuasion can constitute a rational process and whether it allows the citizens, e.g., to value genuine virtue itself for its own sake. Such interpretations must explain (or explain away) the methodological passages and the sophisticated aspects of the citizens' education. This category is broad. At one end, it includes interpretations allowing that praise and blame can be rational processes and that they can provide some understanding of genuine virtue and attachment to it for its own sake. At the other end, one might think that the methodological passages are not seriously intended and that the preambles are designed merely to encourage unthinking obedience to the laws.

All these strategies should ultimately show how their interpretation fits with Plato's late epistemology, metaphysics, and psychology.[3] If, for example, the Timaeus holds a Two-Worlds doctrine, then since the vast majority of citizens lack ethical knowledge, they will be limited to belief. At least on one prominent interpretation of the Two-Worlds view, this will restrict them to thinking about sensibles and thus not being able to cognize genuine value properties.

Annas does not engage with these issues and interpretations as much as one might expect. She does remark that the preambles generally work by presenting the law "in terms of praise and blame (praiseworthy shame)" (96). Such persuasion will, however, mostly involve neither "philosophical argument [nor] appeal to non-rational force" (96). But do they appeal to non-rational emotions or to rational considerations that fall short of philosophical argument?

Annas' example of how this works is the hunting law and its preamble (97-100). This law bans certain kinds of hunting and the preamble explains that the banned types encourage laziness (822D-824C). Annas picks an interesting example here. "Lazy" (argos) is a thick ethical concept and is plausibly a sufficient badmaker for a kind of hunting. So even in the relatively unpromising hunting preamble, citizens learn a sufficient condition of the badness of the kind of acts forbidden by law. This still leaves, however, the question of whether simply inculcating a sense of shame, even if it is directed towards the right objects, is sufficient to develop attachments to genuine virtue for its own sake, and whether inculcating true ethical beliefs by making citizens ashamed to hold others is a kind of ethical learning. Since I am sure Annas has something interesting to say on these points, it would have been welcome if she had gone further.

I shall be briefer on the Cicero and Philo chapters which serve as a sort of postscript (albeit an interesting one) to Annas' discussion of Plato. Cicero's On the Laws takes Plato's Laws as a model and agrees with Plato that the laws should persuade the citizens and not merely compel them by threats and force (2.14). In Annas' view, however,

Cicero does not specify an educational programme by which all citizens can be encouraged to think about their laws and ways of life . . . he appeals to philosophy to enlighten people about the force and role of reason in us and in the world, but not everyone has the time or inclination for philosophy. Looking towards an ideal past more than Plato does, Cicero seems content to have philosophy enlighten the leading citizens of the best state, leaving most citizens with merely the rudiments; he has more faith than Plato in the good direction given by traditional ways of life which leave it to leading citizens to provide guidance. (177-8)

At most, the large majority of citizens should recognize that the laws have some objective basis. The more philosophically inclined will grasp that this is cosmic reason as the Stoics understood it.

Annas makes the interesting argument that although Cicero insists that natural law has authority (imperium) and is directive, the laws of nature should not be seen as having a strictly law-like form, that is, as prescribing or forbidding certain types of action. Natural law should instead be identified with right reason in the mind of the wise person (182). The average citizen will, of course, fall far from this ideal, but Cicero finds it acceptable that most will be governed by a system of law that expresses what natural law requires and which turns out to be Roman law as it existed in a better past and which has "universal validity" (182).

We see in Philo a tension similar to that noted above in the Laws with, Annas thinks, a more pessimistic resolution. Annas argues that unlike Cicero, who sought to emulate Plato, Philo, despite being influenced by the Laws, saw Plato as just another pagan lawgiver who is surpassed by Moses, although he can be useful in explicating Mosaic law. Like Cicero, Philo understands law in terms of Stoic natural law and, like both Cicero and Plato, thinks that the law should lead the people to virtue and thus to happiness. On the one hand, in The Life of Moses, Philo echoes the Laws' passage about free and slave doctors and claims that Moses used preambles (prooimia) and exhorted (protrepsasthai) rather than forced (biasasthai) the people (192). The law even in the form of the Ten Commandments exhorts to virtue and not merely to behavioral conformity. In a way, even ordinary members of a Jewish community learn about the law via Sabbath discussions of it. Nevertheless, Philo thinks that "few are virtuous, and those are mostly people able to retire from busy cities and devote their time to contemplation of nature" (199). Attaining an understanding -- in the sense of a rational appreciation -- of the world as "providentially ordered by God" is beyond most people in Philo's view, while Plato "is more optimistic about the capacity of ordinary citizens to achieve this" (199 with 194, but cf. 205).

As is the habit of reviewers, I have concentrated on points that I found problematic and areas of disagreement. But this should not overshadow this book's great value. It is a major contribution both to the novel main question that it develops and to the standing debates that it touches upon. Anyone interested in ancient ethics or political philosophy will learn a great deal from it.

[1] My translation.

[2] Some Straussians see the methodological passages as deliberately misleading:  does Annas?

[3]  Delete “late” if you are a unitarian.