Vital Forces, Teleology and Organization: Philosophy of Nature and the Rise of Biology in Germany

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Andrea Gambarotto, Vital Forces, Teleology and Organization: Philosophy of Nature and the Rise of Biology in Germany, Springer, 2018, 137 pp., $109.99, ISBN 9783319654140.

Reviewed by Georg Toepfer, Center for Literary and Cultural Research Berlin


The book offers a detailed reconstruction of the decisive phase of biology in the German context at the turn of the nineteenth century. In his foreword, François Duchesneau calls the monograph "an important milestone for understanding how biology came about as an independent science" (p. v). The book emerged out of a dissertation and has a clear narrative for the "rise of biology", with the decisive ingredients mentioned in the book's title: vital forces, teleology and organization. The hypothesis of "vital forces", not in the sense of metaphysical but of physical factors specific to living beings, prepared the ground by allowing for an account of life-defining processes such as nutrition, growth and reproduction that depend on the nature of the system itself. "Teleology", understood as internal teleology, offered a general concept for the understanding of the causal working order of organisms as purposeful units, i.e. as systems of interdependent components that are directed towards the development, maintenance and propagation of the system's specific type. "Organization", finally, came to be the central unifying principle which made living beings the distinct class of organized systems or "organisms" as they are known since.

Gambarotto's story also has an explicit opponent in Timothy Lenoir's concept of a "teleomechanist tradition". For Lenoir, the rise of biology in Germany was the result of a non-reductionist research program that combined mechanistic and teleological thinking in a "vital materialism". This research program was, according to Lenoir, based on Kant's Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790) and started from an understanding of teleology as a merely "regulative" principle for the understanding of living systems. Following Kenneth Caneva, Robert Richards and John Zammito, Gambarotto maintains that the crucial step towards biology was not taken by Kant's establishment of teleology as a reflective mode for the understanding -- and the tradition of "teleomechanists" following this integration of teleology into the mechanistic explanation of nature -- but by the philosophers and biologists who dismissed Kant's account of teleology: "The emergence of biology required a discursive break with Kant's understanding of teleology" (p. xvii). Hence, for Gambarotto, the foundational event was not Kant's "regulative" concept of teleology but a shift from a regulative to a constitutive understanding of teleology -- a shift most strongly endorsed by Romantic Naturphilosophie. Although he follows Lenoir in attributing the emergence of biology to a new understanding of teleology, he thinks, contrary to Lenoir, that the much-maligned Romantic Naturphilosophie stood at the beginning of biology because only the Romantic philosophers considered purposeful organization a constitutive characteristic of living beings.

The book has five chapters. After a short introduction presenting the main thesis ("teleology beyond regrets"), the mainline of the argument is developed in four chapters dealing with (1) the debate over formative forces in theories of development in the second half of the eighteenth century and how they are related to the organization of the living body; (2) the physiology of vital forces propagated by Johann Friedrich Blumenbach (1752-1840) and his "Göttingen School"; (3) theories of animal classification and natural history in the tradition of Naturphilosophie; and (4) Gottfried Reinhold Treviranus' (1779-1864) account of the life sciences as a unified field. A final chapter sums up Gambarotto's narrative by focusing on Hegel's critique of Kant' s merely regulative teleology.

Gambarotto's story gets started with Caspar Friedrich Wolff's (1734-1794) explanation of organic development in terms of purely natural forces without recourse to God's activity. Wolff postulated a specific "essential force" whose role it was to organize the primordial homogeneous substance of the "germ" (Keim) into a living being. As this organizing force depends on the coagulating fluids and self-replicating particles in the living body, Gambarotto speaks of a "self-organizing process" (which, surely, is not Wolff's term). The essential point of Wolff's account, according to Gambarotto, is its naturalistic basis. It resulted in a conception of life in which the organizing role of the "soul" was replaced by attractive and repulsive physical forces. However, the details of this replacement were unclear. This was already criticized by contemporaneous naturalists such as Charles Bonnet who remarked that Wolff did not give an explanation of how the "essential force" emerged from the unorganized germ and how it produced a specific form for each kind of animal without evoking a teleological principle. At this point in the story, Blumenbach and his idea of a "formative drive" (Bildungstrieb) comes in. Contrasting it with Wolff's ateleological "essential force", Gambarotto describes the "formative drive" as a "goal-directed principle of vital organization that supervises the process of organic development" (p. 10).

Following Richards and Zammito, Gambarotto distinguishes Blumenbach's "formative drive" from Kant's "formative force" inasmuch as Blumenbach ignored the Kantian distinction between constitutive and regulative principles. This distinction is explained by Gambarotto as being a result of Kant's adherence to an intentional model of teleology: For Kant, the purposeful organization of an organism can be understood as possible only by assuming that the organism was intentionally designed by an external agent. But, as it was impossible for Kant to appeal to God in his naturalistic account, he had to qualify the intentional stance as merely an "as if"-position and, consequently, could not make teleology a constitutive principle of organized beings. In contrast to this philosophical account, the members of the "Göttingen School" had a straightforwardly realistic understanding of teleology. They saw the "internal teleology" of organisms as a matter of fact and any "vital force" as nothing more than a consequence of this organization.

The second chapter is devoted to an analysis of the "Göttingen School" as a historical entity and the physiology of vital forces. Gambarotto follows Lenoir's thesis that, at the end of the eighteenth century, Blumenbach and his students at Göttingen, particularly Carl Friedrich Kielmeyer (1765-1844), Heinrich Friedrich Link (1767-1851) and Treviranus, formed a coherent school of thought that was important for the constitution of biology in the German context. One fundamental "building block" of this school was provided by Albrecht von Haller's distinction of sensibility and irritability as two organic faculties inherent to the nerves and muscular fibers respectively. Blumenbach and his students extended Haller's conceptual model by integrating these faculties into a system of "organic forces" which included the "formative drive", "contractility" and "vitae propriae" (a faculty of contraction of specific organs). The epistemological value of these systems of forces was, according to Gambarotto, to allow for the formulation of organic laws that regulate the distribution of vital forces within the living world. These were for the most part laws of compensation, such as the inverse relationship between fertility and size in animals. Gambarotto claims that the whole theoretical framework for these laws was "grounded in an idea of teleology conceived in terms of internal purposiveness and self-organization" (p. 47) and can be interpreted as "the first systematic program for a general biology in the German speaking lands" (p. 50).

In his third chapter, Gambarotto shows how teleological thinking became important for the classification of animals and the reform of natural history at the beginning of the nineteenth century. Several approaches are discussed that extend teleology to the whole of nature and connect life forms of different species into one coherent "universal organism". Kant, for example, in his review of Herder's Ideen and elsewhere, at least allowed for the idea of a universal "kinship" of "all genera" resulting from their descent from a single "original genus" -- although he dismissed these views as "monstrous ideas", as Gambarotto stresses. Most of the ideas on the transformation of species at that time were not proto-phylogenetic but were meant to provide a system for ordering and classifying animals on the basis of common archetypes. This holds particularly true for Goethe's morphological framework, in which concepts such as "type" and "metamorphosis" appear as methodological tools for comparative studies rather than phylogenetic searches for real ancestry. By extending morphological and physiological ideas to the whole of nature, Schelling considered the animal kingdom to be a series of functions that are reciprocally in balance in their distribution among the different classes of animals. In the writings of Lorenz Oken, this kind of systems thinking resulted in the integration of anatomy, physiology, chemistry and classification of animals into one coherent system of knowledge which he termed "biology". Gambarotto focuses on the "synthetic attitude" of this thinking in which a priori deduction played a major role.

Gambarotto's fourth chapter is devoted to Treviranus' conception of the life sciences as a unified field that he termed "biology". Treviranus is described as one of the first thinkers who understood the morphological series of animal forms as a self-organizing process that unfolded in historical time. He did so by transferring the concept of the organism from the individual to the entire earth, claiming that every single part of the world "is simultaneously cause and effect, means and purpose, and the whole an endless organism". Treviranus not only claimed that the parts mutually depended on each other, i.e. that the earth was an organized system. He was also one of the first thinkers to address the relationship between the organism and its environment and specified the main function of organisms as "self-preservation". Repeatedly, Gambarotto proposes to interpret this in terms of "homeostasis", but unfortunately does not elaborate on the relationship between self-preservation and self-organization. For Gambarotto, Treviranus' emphasis on self-preservation as the ultimate goal of the living organization is just another example of the understanding of teleology as a constitutive feature of living systems. However, self-organization and self-preservation are quite distinct aspects of organismic "self-activity": "organization" refers to the constitution of a system, while "preservation" is concerned with the maintenance of a system that has already been constituted.

In the short concluding chapter, Gambarotto repeats his central thesis that is directed against Kant's conception of teleology by referring to Hegel's critique of Kant. Hegel criticized Kant's intentional model for teleology because it cannot be applied to self-organizing systems in nature. In Gambarotto's interpretation, Kant's intentional understanding of teleology is the reason for its merely reflective character in the context of his natural philosophy. However, Gambarotto ignores the fact that Kant was claiming a merely regulative status even for his non-intentional model of intrinsic teleology. In order to get a fuller understanding of the achievements and shortcomings of Kant's teleology, it surely would have been helpful to look more closely at Kant's concepts of "constitutive" and "regulative". In a sense, even for Kant, teleological reasoning plays a constitutive role for our understanding of organisms, as it provides the foundational framework for the cognition of this particular kind of system. Teleological reflection, according to Kant, is the only way for us to obtain an idea of the unity and closure of these systems.

Gambarotto's book has great merits in providing a thorough analysis of some much-neglected thinkers of the Romantic school of Naturphilosophie, particularly Treviranus. He clearly points out how they transformed natural history into a form of comparative physiology which had specific principles and laws distinct from physics and chemistry and which was essential for connecting different strands of biological thinking. It is also plausible to claim that the explanatory program of the "Göttingen School" is "grounded in an idea of teleology conceived in terms of internal purposiveness and self-organization" (p. 47). However, what remains to be specified in more detail is the role of Kantian philosophy in this development. Following Zammito, Gambarotto's essential point is that Kant's teleology was more a hindrance than an aid in the establishment of biology as a special science. But, after all, it was Kant, not the Romantic philosophers, who introduced the idea of an internal teleology consisting of mutual dependence of the parts within a system. Moreover, "self-organization", too, is a Kantian term that was not adopted by many of the naturalists of the "Göttingen School" (as Gambarotto claims). It was in the interpretation of Kant's transcendental philosophy that the noun "self-organization" first appeared and was discussed throughout the nineteenth century (it was introduced in 1798 by Johann Gottlieb Buhle, professor of philosophy in Göttingen since 1787; see It is true that Kant's complex architecture of epistemology played no role in the constitution of biology. However, there can be no doubt that it was Kant who provided the essential concepts of internal teleology and self-organization that proved to be decisive for the establishment of biology as a distinct science.