Vital Nourishment: Departing from Happiness

Placeholder book cover

François Jullien, Vital Nourishment: Departing from Happiness, Arthur Goldhammer (tr.), Zone Books, 2007, 176pp., $25.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781890951801.

Reviewed by David B. Wong, Duke University


This work in comparative philosophy seeks to uncover and question some deeply entrenched assumptions of Western thought by contrasting them with alternative assumptions that are especially well represented in the Daoist text Zhuangzi.  Jullien provides a provocative and often illuminating presentation of the ways in which the Zhuangzi challenges long-standing and influential assumptions about the sharp separation between mind and body, about happiness as the ultimate end of life, and indeed about there being an ultimate end that confers meaning on life.  However, in trying to make the Zhuangzi representative of Chinese thought in general and then drawing a sharp contrast between Chinese and Western thought, Jullien obscures the internal complexity of the representative text and both traditions of thought.

Jullien does not actually employ the terminology of mind and body in talking about the separation he believes to pervade Western thought.  He writes of the body or "organic being," versus the principle of "life" (56) or "animation" (59) or the soul and the "psyche" (58).  His choice of terms reflects his belief that the separation they designate starts with Greek thought.  Chinese thought, by contrast, did not establish such a sharp separation between the principle of life and organic being.  Both emerge from the same "breath-energy" called qi.  In fact, all things are condensations or coagulations of a "diffuse and invisible flow of energy that wends it way ceaselessly through the world, animating as it goes" (76).  Blood, under the qi metaphysic, is a denser, coarser type of qi than the breath of an organic being, but both are versions of the same animating stuff.  The phenomena associated in the West with the soul would in China be associated with lighter, more refined qi, but there is no ontological divide between the lighter and denser versus the coarse and refined.

Accordingly, there is no sharp divide between promoting one's psychic health and promoting one's bodily health.  Instead of two projects, between which one might very well be forced to choose, there is only one project of "feeding life" (yang sheng).  The project is neither narrowly materialistic in conception nor purely spiritual.  A means of nurturing vital potential is refining and "decanting" one's breath-energy through "deep breathing" (that which is refined and decanted is more fluid and therefore more alive).  In addition, Jullien often draws attention to those textual passages that associate "feeding life" with detaching from all "external and particular investments" (18) and concentrating on the capacity for life that lies within.  "External" investments include not just the seeking of ordinary material profit but also engagement in worldly affairs and seeking knowledge of things in the world.  Such investments burden and sap one's vitality by creating stress and anxiety.  One must let go of such external distractions and "relax."  Letting go of fixations on the achievement of particular goals ultimately brings one into connection with a common source of all life and indeed the "all-encompassing world process" (27).

In response to the reader who fears his discussion is collapsing into a New-Ageism of deep breathing, ginseng, and the dao of sex, Jullien explicitly states his intent to rescue what he sees to be a genuine alternative to the Western division between mind and body from the shelves in book stores that are labeled "Health" and "Spirituality."  Ideas about breathing, harmony, and feeding are not to be identified with "pseudophilosophy" (21) but rather coherently integrated into the realm of philosophical reflection.

The full realization of this worthy ambition requires extended reflection on the question, "What does nourishing life aim at?"  Jullien's discussion points to several answers.  One answer is health and longevity (72, 121).  If nourishing the spiritual within oneself is not separate from nourishing the physical, then fulfilling one's capacity for life might be plausibly construed as realizing a capacity for long life that also possesses qualities of supple response to the circumstances at hand.  However, another answer is that nourishing life "does not mean to strive to enhance or prolong it" (34).  Nourishing life aims at nothing.  Striving to enhance or to prolong life is self-defeating.  Attachment to life, writes Jullien, turns against life (39).

As Jullien notes, such a thought appears in the Western tradition, but in the Zhuangzi it must be understood in relation to the theme that feeding life is to reconnect to its common source in the all-encompassing world process.  This process consists of ebbs and flows of contrasting but complementary forces that give rise to each other, one force associated with heaven and with the clear and the light, the other force associated with earth and with the muddy and the heavy (in chapters 21 and 31 of the Zhuangzi the terms yang and yin designate these forces).  Nourishing one's vitality is to make more fluid one's qi so that it can respond intuitively and directly to the alternations of these forces.  Such a picture of nourishing life, according to Jullien, undercuts the notion of goals as guiding life.  The Chinese ideal, claims Jullien, is participation in the world process, and it differs from a final end that explains and organizes all of human life such as Aristotle's eudaimonia.  In Chinese thought there is no final destination.  Indeed, if we are able to "forget" goals, we find that "life itself decides how it will go" (109).  If this strikes the reader as strange, Jullien thinks its strangeness reveals another deeply entrenched assumption of Western thought, one that also starts with the Greeks, that life must have a meaning conferred by a final goal, often construed as happiness.

In his discussion of these conceptions of feeding life, Jullien does indeed pose some arresting issues.  Consider health and longevity.  For those of us who see the sharp separation between mind and body as increasingly untenable, it is striking to reflect on the fact that much philosophy (I deliberately refrain from writing about Western philosophy for reasons that will become clear later) has failed to offer significant observation or theorizing about the ways that physical and spiritual health might intertwine (where 'spiritual' here is construed broadly to include values and outlooks that help human beings find something of a home or refuge in the world).  And it is true that even most contemporary professional philosophers who have rejected the mind-body separation have left comment on the intertwining of the physical and the spiritual to New Agers.  Consider the theme that feeding life has no aim.  The academic ethicist might ridicule or ignore that theme, but the idea that forgetting final goals and identifying with an all-encompassing process can bring acceptance of whatever comes probably holds appeal to more people than anything the academic could have to say to them.

Along with these bows to Jullien there needs to be some puzzled head shaking.  It should be observed that he never directly addresses the apparent contradiction between the answer of "Longevity" as the aim of feeding life and the answer of "Nothing" as the aim.  One possible way of addressing it is to say that longevity is still the desired effect but that realizing it requires that one not take it as one's aim.  Jullien suggests this mode of reconciliation often, e.g., "Only when an effect is not sought can it flow in all its fullness; only then can we allow it to proceed" (113).  By analogy, one aims to go to sleep at the appropriate time, but taking sleep as one's aim often produces the contrary result.

Such reconciliation, however, requires grappling with textual passages suggesting a more radical "forgetting" of all goals and aims.  These passages concern the sage's merger with the all-encompassing world process such that the importance of his individual goals simply melts away.  Indeed, the very distinction between important and unimportant, between desirable and undesirable, melts away so that the sage is able to accept all things that come to him, without clinging to some and fleeing from others.  This theme pulls away from the focus on longevity as the desired result of feeding life (whether this is pursued as an aim or not) and becomes an acceptance of the ebbs and flows of the world process even when an early death is the result.  The story of the four masters in chapter six, for example, portrays a master who falls ill and is on the verge of death, and his primary emotion is that of wonder at what the world process will turn him into next -- a rat's liver or a fly's leg, perhaps.  As A.C. Graham observed in his commentary on and translation of the "inner chapters" of the Zhuangzi, there is nothing more striking in the sensibility of that text than "the ecstatic, rhapsodic tone" in which death is written about.[1]  That, together with chapter five's unusual interest and appreciation for people who are crippled, deformed, and mutilated, but who nevertheless have something that draws people to them, is difficult to square with an interpretation that puts health and longevity as the central organizing theme of the text.

There is still another possible answer to the question about the aim of feeding life.  Consider the implications of another theme in the Zhuangzi, which is the necessity for what Jullien calls "the middle way."  True nourishment, as Jullien observes at one point, consists neither in withdrawal from social life (which would cut off relaxation with others and the protection that the social offers from life's vicissitudes) nor in complete engagement (which would ruin relaxation), but "in the alternation between tendencies" (30).  Engagement seems to require striving after goals.  The celebrated Cook Ding cuts up oxen with such an ease that he has nary a nick in his knife after nineteen years.  He is usually taken as an exemplar of one whose qi is exquisitely responsive to what lies outside him, but he is, after all, not just cutting up oxen on a whim.  A third possible answer suggested by the theme of the middle way, then, is that one should in due measure and at the right time pursue goals such as longevity and social intercourse, on the one hand, and, on the other hand, forget in due measure and at the right time one's goals and "go on vacation" (48) by rambling through the world process with no particular goal in mind.  One can strive after goals as long as one does not become fixated on them at the expense of becoming attuned to the world process and preserving one's flexibility and openness to that which does not fit one's current goals.

Perhaps the plurality of answers as to what is the aim of feeding life can all somehow be reconciled in a consistent picture, or perhaps not.  If not, that may be a sign that the text, perhaps even the "inner chapters," is a heterogeneous mixture of themes from different sources.[2]  Or perhaps the author or authors embraced a plurality of answers and perspectives without trying to recommend a single way of reconciling them.  Jullien gives no guidance on this question.  The text's first seven chapters are called the "inner" chapters and traditionally regarded as mostly the product of the historical Zhuangzi.  The next fifteen chapters, called the "outer" chapters, together with the final eleven chapters, called the "miscellaneous" chapters, are usually thought to come from followers who often take his thought in different and apparently incompatible directions.  Even the inner chapters contain a profusion of themes that are not easily reconcilable.  Moreover, it is extremely difficult to avoid reading the inner chapters without bringing in at least some material of the outer chapters, which provide some of the most vivid and compelling passages of the text and which suggest ways to develop themes found in the inner and miscellaneous chapters.  Different interpretations of the text are distinguished by choices as to which themes to emphasize and how, if at all, to reconcile apparent conflicts with other prominent themes in the text.  While Jullien is right to call attention to the themes that health and long life are goods and that one can come into attunement with the world process, he does not grapple with possible contradictions between these themes and the different ways to construe their relation.

He moreover does not grapple with the profound skeptical questioning of the possibility of knowledge that is expressed in chapter two and that appears to undercut the themes he emphasizes (e.g., passages that question our knowledge that life is a good and death is bad).  Jullien appears to adopt the interpretive strategy of relegating the skepticism to a stage-setting move (140) that clears away obsession with belief and truth in order to induce the relaxation that feeds life.  This interpretation is one among an array of very different possible readings, but there is no rationale given here.  What is not done justice is the playful, "trickster" like quality of the text that renders undecidable which of the many voices, if any, is to be taken as authoritative.

It must also be said that Jullien's stark division between Chinese and Western thought obscures the internal diversity of both sides.  While the mind-body division is a dominant theme in Western thought, Heraclitus, Spinoza, and Whitehead, for example, are significant dissenters and moreover offer alternatives to an atomistic and mechanistic construal of the physical world.  The frontiers of physics, moreover, are destabilizing our conceptions of what matter is and how it differs from energy.  The phenomenon of quantum entanglement has led not a few physicists and (Western) philosophers to wonder whether apparently discrete physical particles are deeply intermeshed in ways we cannot clearly conceive and that go beyond causal relationship.

On the Chinese side of the comparison, Jullien's desire to show that Chinese thought in general rejects a telos for human beings results in a strained reading of Confucian texts such as the Analects and the Mencius.  The final end in those texts, the telos, is living in accord with the human dao (the way for human beings to live, which includes the values of filial piety, respect for authority that is properly exercised, and a ruler's duties of care for his subjects), and is conceived as part of Heaven's dao (Heaven being something like the ordering force of the world).  Jullien cites Mencius in support of his interpretation that the physical and spiritual merge in Chinese thought, but not as a complication to the idea that a telos occupies no important place in Chinese thought.  Sometimes Jullien associates Western thought with belief in a final end the source of which transcends the world.  Conceived in this way, perhaps Western thought does contrast with early Confucian thought (the Confucian Heaven is arguably an immanent ordering force of the world), but many Western philosophers do not hold to a transcendent, final end either (Spinoza, Hume, and many more as we approach the contemporary era).  In any case, Confucian men of letters will rightfully express surprise when Jullien generalizes about the "Chinese man of letters" who is so taken up with adjusting to the flow of things (such immersion in flow apparently is what Jullien thinks it means in Chinese thought to have no final end) that he can assert no "position" against the arbitrary application of force in politics (154-155).  In objection to Jullien, Confucians can point to parts of the Mencius in which the philosopher is portrayed as lecturing kings who overtax their subjects to fund lavish projects and who draft the men to fight wars of territorial expansion (e.g., pretty much all of Books 1A and 1B contain such lecturing).  There is more than one kind of irony in the thought of the staunch moralist Mencius getting crammed into the Procrustean bed of "no telos -- just go with the flow."  Such generalizations of Jullien's are puzzling given that he gestures toward the complexity and internal diversity of Chinese thought in the preface (9-10).  Perhaps he thinks that such a gesture at the beginning constitutes a sufficient qualification to the generalizations that follow, but the reader is left to infer how the generalizations should be qualified.

Dramatic contrasts between Chinese and Western thought tend to obscure the unique features of texts such as the Zhuangzi, for the features are unique not only compared to the Western tradition, but also compared to all other texts in the Chinese tradition as well.  Jullien often provides sensitive and perceptive readings of the text (his discussion of the famous passage about Cook Ding is especially illuminating).  This reader wishes for more of this focused interpretation from Jullien rather than a complete assimilation of the Zhuangzi and other complex and unique Chinese texts to broadly conceived currents in Chinese thought.  There is a way to do comparative philosophy that treats the differences within traditions as significant as the differences across traditions.  Jullien puts his considerable gifts in the service of one half of this comparative project.[3]

[1] A. C. Graham, Chuang-Tzu: The Inner Chapters (Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 2001), p. 23. 

[2] See Graham for an introduction to this kind of picture of the text.

[3] Thanks to Judith Farquhar for very helpful comments on a draft of this review.