Waking, Dreaming, Being: Self and Consciousness in Neuroscience, Meditation, and Philosophy

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Evan Thompson, Waking, Dreaming, Being: Self and Consciousness in Neuroscience, Meditation, and Philosophy, Columbia University Press, 2015, 453pp., $32.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780231137096.

Reviewed by Miri Albahari, University of Western Australia


This is a ground-breaking philosophical exploration of consciousness and the self as they occur across the states of waking, falling asleep, dreaming, lucid dreaming, deep dreamless sleep, out-of-body experiences and dying. Evan Thompson's rich, beautifully written book interweaves lucid prose with relevant personal anecdotes, bringing the latest neuroscience together with ancient contemplative wisdom to offer valuable insight into the nature of consciousness and the self. The first-person methodologies of Indian and Asian contemplative traditions such as Yoga, Vedānta and Buddhism generate data that go beyond the reach of the standard scientific approach taken by Western neuroscience and psychology, for example on the possible presence of consciousness during deep dreamless sleep. At the same time, the Western scientific and philosophical approach serves to temper some of Indian metaphysical assertions, such as the claim that consciousness does not depend upon the brain. Thompson argues convincingly that the different approaches -- combined to form 'neurophenomenology' -- produce data that reinforce and complement each other, solidifying findings that, from just one perspective, would be more speculative (for example, that a minimal moment of reportable object-directed awareness is 10-20ms). One of main theses to emerge from the study is that the self is a fluid process, not a static thing, nor the illusion of a thing. Like clouds, the 'I-making' enacted self breaks up and re-forms with the different states of being, and like a sunlit sky, the luminous and pure background consciousness is able reveal the workings and contents of both, all the more so if cultivated as a meta-awareness through practices of meditation and mindfulness.

An outstanding feature is the book's accessible presentation of up-to-date empirical data on both neuro-psychological research and its interface with studies on meditation. Thompson is unusually well-placed to write such a book. A meditation practitioner and lucid dreamer himself, he's also a renowned philosopher of mind who has for years been an active participant in dialogues among key players in the field, such as his well-known (now-deceased) mentor the cognitive neuroscientist Francisco Varela, the Dalai Lama and leading meditation neuroscientist Richard Davidson. His philosophical contributions to the field of cognitive science (including several previous books) enable him to synthesise the inter-disciplinary findings in a way that not only offers novel answers to existing questions but, like a tantalising Scrabble word, also opens up the field to provocative questions that invite new directions of critical engagement.

In Chapter 1, Thompson draws upon ancient Upaniṣadic tradition to introduce a fourfold map of consciousness which helps organise and inform his book: the states of waking, dreaming, dreamless sleep and pure awareness (the self-illuminating background witnessing consciousness that underlies all the states). Chapter 2 turns to the waking state, where he compellingly argues that neurobiological findings, including from the brains of advanced meditators, concur with the Buddhist Abhidharma view that the stream of perceptual, object-directed consciousness, rather than being a smooth continuous flow, is actually made up of discontinuous, discrete pulses. To debut the idea of an object-directed, dependently arisen and discrete mode of consciousness, Thompson quotes a passage where he takes the Buddha to be admonishing someone for holding an 'Upaniṣadic' view that "one and the same consciousness lies behind the changing mental [and bodily] . . . states" (23). Thompson's rather controversial take on this passage doesn't stop him from later re-introducing into his ontology a pure background (albeit momentary) awareness to carry out unitary functions that he thinks the discontinuous, object-directed consciousness can't perform. Citing Searle, he suggests that the need for an underlying and unified field of background awareness indicates that perceptual, object-directed consciousness, rather than comprising fundamental 'building-blocks' of consciousness, are modulations of that background awareness.

So where does such pure awareness stand in relation to the brain? Thompson addresses this question in Chapter 3, which will interest philosophers who work on the mind/body problem. Drawing on both Indian and Western resources, he introduces an intriguing new position: while conscious awareness is contingent on the brain, it is not reduced to its neurobiological functionings either. Consciousness is not reduced to brain activity, he argues, because any object we become aware of, including models arrived at through scientific investigation, will always show up within the field of consciousness. "given that scientific models of the world are always distillations of our conscious experience as observers, it makes no sense to try to reduce consciousness to one or another of our scientific models, including our models of brain activity" (101). Consciousness cannot therefore be reduced to something non-experiential such as neural firings. It's not clear to me, however, that this doesn't draw a metaphysical conclusion from an epistemic premise by conflating the model itself (the epistemic vehicle) with what the model depicts (the metaphysical content). Of course any model of brain activity will be generated and understood via conscious activity, but it's not obvious that this should bear upon whether the content of the model, which may endorse an identity of consciousness with neural activity, is correct or not.

Thompson goes on to argue that consciousness nevertheless depends upon neurobiological activity in the sense that it's a "natural phenomenon" whose "cognitive complexity increases as a function of the increasing complexity of living beings" (103). Yet he claims it's not a standard emergentist view (where consciousness pops into existence with a required non-mental, physical organisation), nor a panpsychist view (where micro-experiences are attributed to microphysical phenomena), nor an idealist view (where consciousness grounds all reality), nor a dualist view (where conscious and physical phenomena have totally different natures), nor a mysterian view (where we can never know the relation between consciousness and the physical). Instead, it's a framework "in which 'physical' no longer means essentially non-mental . . . physical being and experiential being imply each other or derive from something that is neutral between them" (105). Despite professing to distance his position from Galen Strawson's panpsychism, he needs to do more to show, given his rejection of emergentism, where it exactly differs, as Strawson (2006) also uses the term 'physical' to designate phenomena that include what is mental. It would be good to see Thompson's model more fully delineated in future work.

Chapters 4-6 deal with consciousness and the sense of self in relation to falling asleep, dreaming and lucid dreaming. There's much rich and complex material, but in broad terms the chapters are intended to support Thompson's main argument that the self is a shifting process rather than static entity. In the falling-asleep hypnagogic state, the sense of self slackens and attention becomes absorbed in fragmented images. In ordinary dream, the sense of self reconfigures as a dream-ego, fully identifying with its point of view, taking the contents of the dream to be real. In lucid dream, identity with the dream-ego is supplanted by identity with self-as-dreamer, involving a broader meta-awareness which, through recognising the dream-state for what it is, is able to voluntarily guide attention that is normally hostage to the sequence of images. Here, Thompson makes ingenious use of neurophenomenology to field an objection that lucid dreaming is merely dreaming that one is dreaming as opposed to being aware that one is dreaming. Experiments show, for instance, that it is possible to train the lucid dreamer to use REM (rapid eye movement) and motor signals to objectively relay her state back to the external world.

There's also a forceful, empirically supported argument in chapter 6 for the idea that dreaming is a form of active, spontaneous imagination rather than passive delusional hallucination. Somewhat odd, however, is Thompson's implicit assumption that dreaming is only delusional if it's hallucinatory; if built on imagination, a dream would not be delusional. But surely a dream's delusional status has less to do with what the appearance is made on (imagination or hallucination) than whether its external-seeming content is unassumingly believed by its subject to be really external (a distinction Thompson relies on at other times to distinguish lucid from ordinary dreaming). I suspect that not framing ordinary dreams as delusional aids Thompson's subsequent objection to the idea that the hyper-aware lucid dreaming is in any way 'better' than nonlucid dreaming: "Nonlucid dreams . . . may have their own value, so we shouldn't think of them as being inferior to what they would be if we were lucid in them" (198). This egalitarian stance seems at odds with the soteriological aspiration of Indian traditions to overcome delusion and in puzzling tension with Thompson's own clear approval of the Taoist sage who, unlike the usual dreamer, doesn't identify with -- hence is not deluded by -- their dreaming (or indeed waking) state.

Chapter 7 turns to out-of-body experiences (OBE). Here, Thompson asks whether astral travel or neurobiological events better explain the phenomenological data of appearing to float above or travel away from one's physical body (such as during anaesthesia). While not definitively ruling out the astral hypothesis, he does contend that empirical literature favours the neural explanation. He also notes, convincingly, that out-of-body experiences "reveal something crucial about the sense of self: You locate yourself as an experiential subject wherever your attentional perspective feels located" regardless of where you see your body as being (211). Chapter 8 investigates the phenomenon of deep dreamless sleep, challenging the received neuroscientific view that such a state involves pure blackout. He advocates taking seriously input from contemplative traditions (such as Advaita Vedānta) which contend that pure witnessing consciousness can still be present in deep sleep without any objects that are witnessed. In this highly innovative chapter, Thompson takes us through arguments offered by the Vedānta tradition and offers testable speculations using data from sleep yogis who, trained in contemplation, are potentially able to harness lucid dreaming skills to access (and report back about) deep sleep. My only qualm is that the meta-awareness had by such yogis may not be revealing ordinary deep sleep to be a form of phenomenal consciousness so much as eliciting a mode of conscious awareness that is not normally present.

Chapter 9 asks: what happens to the self and consciousness when we die and how can Yogic traditions help us to existentially frame our perspective on dying? As with the chapter on OBE, Thompson makes careful use of empirical data to debunk what are often careless speculations about survival after bodily death in relation to near death experiences. Those who advocate the survival-after-death hypothesis should welcome rather than ignore his analysis as something to be taken seriously; it clearly advances the discussion. There are, however, other sources of data which Thompson doesn't have room to address, such as the Dhammaruwan's apparent spontaneous (and ancient way of) chanting Buddhist suttas from age 2. It would be interesting to see how he deals with such cases.

Throughout the book, Thompson recruits evidence to support his overarching conclusion that the self is a process rather than an entity or illusion of entity. His culminating argument takes place in his final Chapter 10, on which I'll focus the rest of my discussion. According to a popular reading of Buddhism, our existence comprises impermanent, dependently arising aggregates that involve such factors as physical form, sensations, perceptions, thoughts, emotions, desires and object-directed consciousness. Such ontology leaves no room for an unchanging, persisting, independent, identity-preserving, behind-the-scenes thing that is a thinker of thoughts and doer of deeds. Based on such considerations, which extend beyond Buddhism, some thinkers (he mentions Thomas Metzinger, but there's also Hume, James, Daniel Dennett, Owen Flanagan and myself) deny the existence of this thing commonly called a 'self', deeming it a cognitive illusion that is routinely bought into. Thompson thinks that denying the existence of a self falls prey to an extreme view that the Buddhist figure Nāgārjuna terms 'annihilationism' (and which he terms 'neuro-nihilism'). The no-self view commits ordinary subjects to implausibly affirming the existence of a mysterious "inner substantial essence" that is more the province of "a certain philosophical conception of the self" (365) than anything we routinely buy into through everyday experience.

Thompson seeks, instead, to recast the self as an 'enactive' process (not a thing) that emerges dependent on a collection of self-specifying biological, psychological, social and intersubjective processes he calls 'I-making'. While I cannot do justice here to the careful way in which Thompson develops his model, two crucial elements of the process are "self-designating" and "self-projection". Through self-designating, the person construes him or herself as an individual subject distinct from other individuals. Through self-projection, the faculties of memory and prospection expand the sense of bounded individual self to encompass the past and imagined future, creating the sense of being a distinct, enduring, and unique thinker of thought and doer of deeds. These processes of identification help to mentally construct a fluid self, which is broken down upon falling asleep and deep dreamless sleep to be reassembled upon dreaming and waking. Thompson is adamant that the self's mentally constructed status does not entail its illusory status.

Is his portrayal of no-self theorists a fair one? In better understanding how the self gets cast as illusory, it's useful to clarify a distinction they sometimes make between 'self' and 'sense of self'. The self is whatever it is that we take ourselves to be (the content); the sense of self is the feeling or appearance that we have of being such a self (the vehicle). Those who deny the existence of a self -- construed for example as an underlying, persisting, thinker of thoughts -- are not generally denying that we have the elusive feeling/sense of being such a self -- only that there's really such a self that the feeling portrays. The claim that the self is an illusion indeed relies on the sense of self being a real impression that reflexively generates such false content as 'I am an underlying thinker of thoughts'. What makes the content false is that it is not part of a specified ontology. But note: nothing in this account of self-as-illusion commits the notion of self to designating a mysterious inner substantial essence -- it's enough that one harbours the sense of being something that, in a specified reality (such as Buddhist ontology), doesn't exist. Thompson's portrayal of the no-self proponent as being committed to a baroque 'annihilationist' view is thus off-target. And significantly, in keeping with Buddhist ontology Thompson himself does not permit the very thing that he says we as subjects construe ourselves to be (through processes of self-designation and self-projection): an ongoing, behind-the scenes, independent thinker and agent. There's just the appearance or sense or feeling of being such a thing.

The real difference between Thompson's view and that of the no-self proponent turns out not to be so much in the metaphysics as in the semantics. He is proposing to shift the definition of 'self' away from the content -- the thing we take ourselves to be -- to the vehicle which carries this content: the sense of being such a thing. Semantically collapsing the distinction between self and sense of self obviates the need to cast the self as non-existing or illusory. The self is just the feeling of being a certain entity, a feeling which, grounded in various processes, is real enough. This revisionary move has precedents in the history of science. The atom used to be defined as an indivisible entity. The discovery that we could split the atom did not lead scientists to deny that atoms exist; the definition of atom was rather revised to allow for its divisibility. Thompson proposes we do something similar for the self. The discovery that there's no actual such thing as a persisting, underlying thinker/owner/actor should not lead us to deny the existence of self but to revise our definition of self to accommodate its status as a process rather than thing.

But while Thompson's description of the processes that go into constructing the sense of self has much to commend it, his move to redefine self as sense of self has implications that go beyond the terminological. In a Buddhist (and indeed, Vedānta) context, deflating talk of a non-existent, illusory self undercuts a pivotal way to describe and examine its central soteriological goal of 'awakening', a profound insight that is supposed to liberate the practitioner from all mental suffering. For unlike the atom, which doesn't wear a purportedly indivisible nature on its sleeve (and hence does not involve illusion), the 'self's' purportedly independent, permanent, background presence as a thinker, owner and agent is in -- or rather behind -- our face all the waking (and often dreaming) time, impacting upon our experiential life, attaching us to things being a particular way, driving us to act, making the thought of our death ungraspable, stopping us from seeing our nature as it really is. That is why the historical Buddha repeatedly urges his disciples to not view the conditioned elements of their psycho-physical constitution in terms of a permanent, independent self, as most of us are prone to do, but as impermanent and co-dependent aggregates which, if identified with as a self, cause suffering. Indeed, as I argue at some length (2014), coming to the eventual realisation that there isn't any such (persisting, underlying) thing on behalf of which one is acting involves directly recognizing this thing, the self, as an illusion. If 'awakening' is indeed possible, then seeing through the illusion of self is a powerful explanatory mechanism by which we can come to understand the profound cognitive shift that is said to occur. Denying recourse to the idea of self-as-illusion not only leaves under-described a central element of Buddhist practice but threatens to elide a crucial explanatory device that could account for its most important insight.

In the final pages, Thompson does address the Buddhist goal of liberation from suffering in an account that "makes no claim [to which] any other Indian yogic philosopher would agree" (366). Such liberation, Thompson writes,

doesn't consist in dismantling our constructed sense of self . . . Rather, it consists in wisdom that includes not being taken in by the appearance of the self as having independent existence while that appearance is nonetheless still there and performing its important I-making function. Nor does "enlightenment" or "liberation" consist in somehow abandoning all I-making or "I-ing" -- all self-individuating and self-appropriating activity -- though it does include knowing how to inhabit that activity without being taken in by the appearance of there being an independent self that's performing that activity and controlling what happens. (366)

A way to envisage what Thompson is saying -- although it may force him to concede that the self is, after all, an illusion (and towards the end he seems more willing to admit that there's something illusory about a self) -- is to liken 'liberation' to coming to realise that an optical illusion that one was previously taken in by, such as the Müller-Lyer Illusion, is just an illusion -- that of two lines being of unequal length. The lines continue to look unequal -- the self continues to appear independent -- but there's no longer the deeper emotions and behaviours that go with believing the content to be veridical. The illusion persists; the delusion disappears. Unfortunately, as I've argued elsewhere (2014), such a model won't easily apply to the self. The gist of the argument is that being deeply reflexive, the very I-making processes that create the illusion of being a self also create the delusion that one is such a self. The illusion and delusion of self cognitively rise and fall together, qualifying and filtering the very subjective perspective (or underlying pure witnessing consciousness) through which one encounters the world of objects, thoughts and perceptions. In this respect, the sense of self is like dirt on a lens. Until cleaned, a dirty lens will inhibit any clear view of itself or the world. Cleaning the subjective lens through such practices as meditation means coming to dispense with the sense of being an independent, controlling self, polishing away all processes of self-appropriation and I-making. Or so I argue.

Despite these critical remarks (perhaps, indeed, because of them) I believe that Thompson has written a very important and progressive work on how cross-traditional neurophenomenology can help us to explore and come to understand the spectrum of different conscious states, some of which, until this book, have barely received Western philosophical scrutiny. For this reason, the book should be an absolute staple for anyone interested in the intersection of philosophy of mind and contemplative traditions. It pushes the subject to new frontiers in a way that is rigorous, analytical, empirically informed and interestingly controversial. The acceptance and integration of Indian and Asian thought into the Western philosophical arena has still some way to go. Thompson has done a huge service by helping bring to the topic the respectability it deserves.


Albahari, Miri, 'Insight Knowledge of No Self in Buddhism: An Epistemic Analysis', Philosophers' Imprint, Vol 14, No.21, 2014, 1-30

Strawson, Galen, 'Realistic Monism: Why Physicalism Entails Panpsychism', Journal of Consciousness Studies, 2006, 13, No.10-11, 3-31