Walter Benjamin: an Introduction to his Work and Thought

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Uwe Steiner, Walter Benjamin: an Introduction to his Work and Thought, Michael Winkler (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2010, 230pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226772219.

Reviewed by Julian Roberts, LMU-Munich


Is concern with Walter Benjamin a form of political activism? Should it be? This question has divided commentators since the 1960s, when Benjamin served not only as a banner for the student revolt, but also -- in direct contrast -- as a model for the sober scholarship gradually returning to the German universities.

Undoubtedly the latter view has prevailed, if only in the sense that Benjamin today is a staple of the Ph.D. industry. Steiner's book, which in essence is a chronological catalogue of Benjamin's oeuvre, rather confirms this. There is nothing wrong with this, in principle. Certainly there is only a limited amount of mileage to be extracted from Benjamin's career as a martyr, moving though it may be. And his work provides little direct guidance for the class struggle.

Despite this, criticism of the universities, or more generally of intellectual practice in general, underlies Benjamin's whole project. From our perspective, it is not just the oft-lamented failure of Frankfurt University to recognise Benjamin's talents which need concern us. German universities were at the forefront of the whole Nazi "movement", as indeed were other major components of public culture including the legal system and even, in part, the Churches. All these institutions, little changed, still exist. Is it possible to do justice to Benjamin's work without raising questions which bear directly on modern academic life? This is an issue which Steiner, consistent with the sober approach taken by his book, does not pursue. Related topics which have to be mentioned because of their prominence in Benjamin's work, such as the "Strategist in the Literary Struggle", are firmly consigned to scare quotes. At the end of his book, when Steiner raises the question of Benjamin's "relevance", he rather despairingly finds it in the fact that academics seem forever able to discover "new and hitherto overlooked aspects in his oeuvre".

This strikes me as a little disappointing, and it certainly raises the question of what Steiner might have missed in his subject. If one thing is missing in Steiner's basically thorough account, it is not the leftist political background, which he explains quite fully, but something rather different, namely theology. Benjamin regularly appeals to themes from "theology". He did not define what he meant by this term, except indirectly in the famous first Thesis on the Philosophy of History, where theology is the master dialectician whose resources enable politically progressive standpoints ("historical materialism") to prevail in argument. This master, Benjamin concedes, is a dwarf who is "small and ugly, and cannot allow himself to be seen".

Theology, for Benjamin, is the form of analysis which can identify the primary ideological underpinning of a social and economic system. In that sense it is able to make good claims which "historical materialism", left to itself, cannot do. But obviously "theology" isn't "historical materialism". So what is it?

One way of understanding the term is to emphasise the attribute of concealment. Theology, by that account, is the esoteric, the concealed, the elite. "Even though the esoteric cannot determine the practical implementation of learning, nonetheless learning's laws of form and content inevitably appear to great researchers as theologically determined", Benjamin noted in his sketches for One-Way Street (Steiner quotes this passage with approval). Benjamin's model for this esotericism seems to have been the George circle, according to which the unacknowledged leaders of progress were the poets and artists, protected from the baser elements of life by a devoted coterie of disciples.

Benjamin undoubtedly felt some sympathy for the esoteric, if only in the sense that the profundity and opacity of his own work made few concessions to the casual reader. To set this at the heart of his thinking would be wrong, however. The connection between theology and the esoteric is fortuitous. However much Benjamin may have valued certain aspects of the George circle's work, he regarded it as politically entirely reactionary.

The second manifestation of "theology" in Benjamin's thinking is what might be called the millenarian aspect. Millenarianism, at least in the context of the early twentieth century, was the notion that a thousand-year New Order was about to arrive, led either by the Aryan race or by the proletariat, according to taste. One relatively sophisticated application of this was Carl Schmitt's argument that the true sovereign was he who ruled over the emergency, revolutionary emergencies being the lawless and formless instant from which the genuinely new proceeded. Benjamin's own take on this was, by contrast, nihilistic. For him, the hiatus was to arise by means of humankind's "pulling the emergency cord" and turning its back on history altogether. The epistemology associated with this plays a prominent part in Benjamin's work, whether it be the notion of reading history against the grain, of dialectical instants, or of the "leap under the open skies of history". Benjamin valued Schmitt's work, particularly the notion of the revolutionary instant, which he linked with his own insistence on the "extreme" as the point at which truth becomes manifest.

Obviously, most of these themes and sources are tainted. Millenarianism was more prominent on the right of the political spectrum than on the left. The notion that history would pass through an Archimedean point and re-emerge in a new era (the "third Reich", as Stefan George liked to call it) was a commonplace of German fascism. Schmitt, a ready convert to these steamy politics, theorised the legitimacy of Hitler's autocracy. Benjamin knew all this. If he used motifs of this sort anyway, it was because the roots of his own position lay elsewhere -- in the third form of "theology".

The third form of theology is of a more conventional kind. It is the theology that appears explicitly in the Trauerspiel book, namely the opposition between Catholicism and Protestantism. Benjamin studied the work of the great Protestant theologian Adolf von Harnack early in his career (the History of Dogma is no. 524 on Benjamin's "List of Works Read"), and not only the explicitly theological themes, but also his whole political world-view, are informed by these concerns. There are three elements to this: epistemology, the theory of the priesthood, and egalitarianism.

Benjamin's Protestant epistemology is set out most fully in the Trauerspiel book. His critique of symbolism is a critique of Catholic sacramentalism -- the doctrine that significant acts (of the Church) are, as Augustine has it, a "visible sign of an invisible reality". In sacramental terms, all visible things recur to the one underlying reality. Against this Platonistic vision (Benjamin termed it symbolism) Benjamin asserted the notion of "allegory". In allegory, unity is illusionary. The patterns of existence are arbitrary and fragmentary. Symbols participate in the invisible reality, but, for allegory, truth is always irrecoverably "beyond". The correct attitude to it is not contemplative immersion, but what Benjamin called "melancholy", the casual attention of the passer-by.

As to the second element, the priesthood: When Benjamin considers the strategy of intellectuals in the class struggle, he is in fact tackling a topic with a long history, and one which continues to be of immediate relevance in the contemporary Catholic church (see Ratzinger's extensive work on ecclesiology). What is a priest? Does he (no "she", so far!) have privileged access to the truth? In orthodox Catholic doctrine, the answer is yes. The ordination of priests is a sacrament. By virtue of that sacrament the priest in turn is enabled to administer the sacraments, thereby conjoining visible form with the invisible reality.

This is the conceptual model not only for the Catholic Church, but also for traditional German views of intellectuals. In Germany, university professors, like priests, are "ordained" (they are called "Ordinarius"). The George circle's approach -- solemn rituals in Greek costume, and the like -- was only a camp and overheated version of what still, even today, informs intellectual orthodoxy. One reason why German universities are so hard to reform is the continuing fascination with the idea that professors have direct and privileged access to wisdom.

Benjamin's riposte was to explore the economic reality of intellectual life. Intellectuals are part of the market economy. They have no magic privileges beyond what their labour gains for them. Fantasies of esoteric power are vain and foolish. If intellectuals have power, they have it as traders, not as priests. Awareness of this status is not incompatible with the highest level of artistic competence. Under high capitalism, indeed, that awareness is positively a precondition for worthwhile art -- see Benjamin's admiration of Baudelaire, Atget, Meryon and other Parisian melancholics.

As to the third element, egalitarianism and the laity: In Catholic terms, the Church is God's representative on Earth, and access to God, or to the Truth, is mediated by priests. This has clear consequences for the distribution of power. Within the church, a strict hierarchy obtains -- the pope at the top, the parish priest at the bottom ("hierarchy" means "rule of mystery"). From this arises, for example, the doctrine of papal infallibility -- there is no-one higher up left to challenge papal insights. The hierarchy provides an analogy for the distribution of power not only in the church, but in the secular world as well.

In contrast to this, Protestants appealed to Christ's declaration, "For where two or three are gathered together in my name, there am I in the midst of them" (Matthew 18:20). This was understood to justify the notion of the "priesthood of all believers". From that point of view, the appointment of a priest is nothing special, and certainly not a sacrament. Moreover, because every Christian is equally close to God, and priests are not needed in order to mediate, there is no call for a hierarchy either inside or outside the church. The egalitarianism implicit in this is directly applicable to politics -- as instanced by the celebrated anecdote about Thomas Moore, the Quaker who refused to take his hat off to Charles II.

Benjamin's own political beliefs are not much more specific than the egalitarianism urged by Protestant theology. However, the implications for his "ecclesiology" (in his case, the theory of intellectuals) and his epistemology are detailed and sophisticated. In that context, Benjamin's thought has practical implications of a quite pragmatic sort -- not as flaming images of martyrdom, but as an attempt to get to grips with what being an intellectual under high capitalism is about.

Indeed, one question which arises is quite simple: does it, today, make sense to try to institutionalise "culture" in things called "universities"? Benjamin, I suspect, thought not. And I think he would have been a little sad at his work becoming a repository of "new and hitherto overlooked" research topics.