War: Essays in Political Philosophy

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Larry May (ed.), War: Essays in Political Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 325pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521700047.

Reviewed by Helen Frowe, University of Sheffield


1. General Overview

This is a splendid, cohesive collection of extremely engaging essays, bringing together some of the most influential contemporary experts on just war theory. The essays are well-written, mostly well-argued, and address pressing questions across a broad spectrum of issues in the ethics of war, including the ethics of humanitarian intervention, the relationship between jus ad bellum and jus in bello, proportionality, and the moral status of war crimes. The book is divided into four sections: Historical Background (Gregory Reichberg, Nicholas Rengger), Initiating War (Larry May, Jeff McMahan, Cindy Holder, James Bohman), Waging War (Thomas Hurka, David Leftkowitz, Steven P. Lee, Michael Davis, Marilyn Friedman) and Ending War (Trudy Govier, Christopher Heath Wellman, David Luban, Nancy Sherman). I will begin with an overview of the book, before offering a more detailed evaluation of two chapters.

Chapters one and two both offer really very good, focused accounts of the historical roots of key aspects of the just war tradition, sticking firmly to the issues at hand and avoiding digression into matters of general historical interest. In the first chapter, Gregory Reichberg explores the moral equivalence of nations, outlining how theorists have approached the issue of whether a war can be just on both sides, and paying particular attention to the justice of pre-emptive and preventative war. In the second chapter, Nicholas Rengger examines changing perceptions of the relationship between jus ad bellum and jus in bello. Rengger traces the emergence of jus in bello as a matter of international business, rather than a private, internal matter of the discipline of a nation's soldiers, giving a lucid explanation of the current dominance of in bello legislation over the historically much weightier issue of ad bellum justice.

The second section contains excellent essays by Larry May and Jeff McMahan on the topic of just cause, both of which are considered in more detail below. Cindy Holder's essay on humanitarian intervention argues that it is a mistake to think that respect for sovereignty is the bar to solving humanitarian crises. Holder suggests that, "the central problem confronting the international community in humanitarian crises is not the problem of sovereignty but the problem of state" (pp. 98-9). Holder argues that humanitarian crises are typically caused by the injustice that is inherent in all actual states. This injustice emerges partly as a result of the belief that an effective state must assimilate all the rival or alternative systems within its territory. According to Holder, an integral part of tackling crises abroad is tackling injustice at home, since "[j]ustice at home is a prior condition of our being able to trust our diagnoses of what changes are required, both in the international system and in other states, to remedy propensities to abuse and neglect" (p. 103). This claims strikes me as suspect, since even an inherently unjust state can be considerably more just than another state, and one need not be (perfectly) just in order to know what is just. That we are busy rooting out injustice at home is small consolation to those suffering systematic violence abroad.

James Bohman explores the recent fascination with spreading democracy by the distinctly undemocratic means of military force. Bohman suggests that, irrespective of the justness of using war to spread democracy, such wars fail to achieve their goal. Wars preclude the desirable feature of democracy, namely the ability of citizens to organise their social and political systems, since such rights are suspended in favour of security and control. Bohman argues persuasively that by imposing a hierarchal system in which power lies not with ordinary citizens, but rather with those officials representing the invading state, wars of democracy are more likely to undermine democracy than promote it. The spreading of democracy should be focused primarily on encouraging democracy across nations, using transnational institutions like the EU as a paradigm of how multi-state democracies can facilitate democratic goals beyond the reach of individual democratic states.

The third section of the book contains essays on proportionality, collateral damage, weapons of mass destruction, torture and terrorism. Michael Davis supplies the now-obligatory essay on the permissibility of torture, nicely summarising the main arguments in favour of torture in emergency cases before arguing that even in such cases, torture is not morally justified. It is hard to resist the sense, however, that we have reached quite a stalemate in this debate, and whilst Davis's essay works well in the collection, speaking to what has become a central question in just war theory, it retreads what is already pretty familiar ground without really pushing the debate forward.

Marilyn Friedman's wonderfully readable, if somewhat disjointed, essay on the moral status of female terrorists begins with a summary of the debate surrounding the definition of terrorism, and why this matters for our condemnation of terrorism. Friedman then argues that just as soldiers can be excused for performing wrongful actions if they perform them under orders, women might be excused for terrorist actions if they perform them as a result of habitual obedience to male leaders. Indeed, Friedman suggests that the fact that the subordination of women is often much more systematic and extensive than the subordination of soldiers to their leaders, such women might be deemed generally exempt from moral responsibility. Of course, the extent of responsibility will vary with the extent of subordination. But Friedman presents a thought-provoking, if controversial, case for why we may well be justified in treating male and female terrorists differently. This essay is insightful and well-argued, although I'm not sure how much the earlier, more general sections on terrorism add to the discussion of the specific issue of female terrorists.

The final section of the book deals with the growing area of jus post bellum: justice in the aftermath of war. Trudy Govier's essay addresses the issue of reconciliation, urging that aims of retribution must play a subsidiary role to aims of restoration. Interestingly, she stresses the need for reconciliation between those who fought together as well as between those who fought each other. The stigmatising of those deemed to have broken the in bello rules can be significant, even amongst members of the perpetrators' own group. If allowed to persist, this exclusion can lead to yet more violence, and enable other group members to illegitimately deflect blame away from themselves onto the excluded minority.

Christopher Heath Wellman's essay discusses the difficult topic of granting of amnesties for those suspected of war crimes, and requiring that the international community respect such amnesties. Wellman argues that there should be a presumption against amnesties. But, they should nonetheless be respected when they are granted by a legitimate state in the pursuit of suitably significant goods, like long-term national stability or the removal of an oppressive regime. Despite acknowledging that other states or victims might have a legitimate interest in prosecuting all war criminals, Wellman argues that this interest does not establish a right that such prosecutions take place. A state is at liberty to decide against prosecuting an individual for crimes committed within its territory. However, Wellman stresses that, on his account, only legitimate states can grant amnesties. The international community is not obliged to respect amnesties granted by illegitimate leaders that are intended to protect those leaders' own interests, rather than the interests of the state.

David Luban's essay on war crimes argues against the idea that the very nature of war precludes any legal constraints on what may be done. Luban suggests that practical humanitarianism -- a pragmatic project of minimising the transgressions of war that will not always correlate with morality -- underlies the rules of war. We do not hold wars to the standards of ordinary morality, but nor do we cast morality out as soon as wars begin. Luban considers the question of who bears responsibility for war crimes -- the soldier following an illegal order, or his commander for issuing the order -- and concludes that there might not be a universal standard applicable to all armed forces, given the radically different natures and histories of such groups.

The final, and very interesting, essay by Nancy Sherman investigates the role that a desire for revenge plays in war. Sherman argues that despite the generally negative perception of revenge, it is closely connected to emotions like anger and indignation that are often thought to be both warranted and useful when dealing with loss. Revenge is about reasserting oneself after loss, and, Sherman says, can help victims overcome the sense of helplessness that might otherwise persist after the offence. Rather than aim to eliminate the thirst for revenge, we ought to try to mitigate its destructiveness, for example by recognising the role that expressing grief can play in reducing the desire to get one's own back. Sherman's essay offers a novel perspective on this issue, drawing on both Stoic and Aristotelian models of the good warrior to illuminate her view.

2. Some thoughts on May and McMahan

Larry May's own essay tackles the issue of just cause for war, arguing against the conventional separation of jus ad bellum and jus in bello. Questions about the tactics that will be employed to fight a war, for example, are generally conceived of as an in bello issue, irrelevant to whether or not the war itself is just. May presents a convincing case to the contrary, arguing that the justice of the war will depend in part on the tactics that are likely to be employed in the pursuit of that war's goals. If the ends of a war can be achieved only through the use of disproportionate means, we do not have a just cause for war. May claims that we should narrow the category of what counts as a just cause to exclude mere territorial invasion, specifying instead that territorial invasion is a just cause only if it threatens lives or human rights on a scale comparable to the losses of war.

However, despite this narrowing of the number of causes that a state can legitimately cite as cause for war, May thinks we should lessen the standard of proof required from individuals who are being tried for the crime of aggression. May proposes that "just cause be easier to prove, and aggression correspondingly harder to prove, in international criminal proceedings than in discussions of possible sanctions against states for aggression" (p. 64). May's rationale is based partly on the purpose of international criminal trials, namely to discourage state leaders from acting aggressively. But, he says, "the consequence of such trials is that individuals are put in prison not merely that states are encouraged to act more peacefully" (p. 64). May argues that courts must not presume that leaders had knowledge of the illegality of their state's war, since this unjustly finds them guilty by position or association. Even leaders can be ignorant, although May concedes that they must show that their ignorance did not amount to negligence, claiming that, "It is not enough for these leaders to say that they did not know, but rather that it was very difficult for them to find out" (p. 63).

I agree that fairness rules against a presumption of guilt when it comes to the prosecution of individuals. However, there is still the question of what counts as guilt for a person in a high-ranking position. There ought to be a default position of waging war only when one knows that one's war is just. It is not enough that one has not discovered that the war is unjust. May argues that leaders need not independently investigate whether or not their state has just cause because such action could be very dangerous. But he also argues that leaders who doubts a war's legality ought not to, "blind themselves to facts that would confirm their suspicions" (p. 63). Surely this too could be very dangerous, not least because May would presumably require some resistance on the part of a leader who discovers that his war is, in fact, unjust. That resistance would have been dangerous, however, would not warrant an acquittal of the crime of aggression in the absence of such resistance. It is thus not obvious why the danger of independent investigation should warrant an acquittal of the same crime.

It is also hard to endorse May's apparent separation of the deterrence of state aggression and the punishment of state leaders. One cannot encourage a state to act more peacefully: it is only state leaders who can be so encouraged. To hold leaders responsible for a failure to investigate the justness of a war is not to fail to respect their rights by presuming their guilt in virtue of their office. Rather, it is to adjust what counts as guilt in virtue of the responsibilities that come attached to that office. To suggest that a state can be found guilty of aggression while the state leaders are found innocent seems not to apply justifiably different standards to different things, but rather different standards to the same thing. To make it easier for leaders to claim or 'prove' just cause will not deter state aggression, since the aggression of a state just is the aggression of its leaders.

Jeff McMahan's essay argues that, properly understood, both aggressive and punitive wars can be justified. McMahan suggests that aggression consists in striking the first blow: in the use of force that is not a response to a prior act of force by the target state. On this account, pre-emptive and preventative wars are acts of aggression, but they are, crucially, defensive aggression. The aim of the force is to defend the state against imminent or future attack. Wars of humanitarian intervention are also examples of defensive aggression, with defence of others as the aim of the aggressive force. If we accept that such wars are acts of defence, and that such wars are at least sometimes justified, then we have wars of aggression -- of striking the first blow -- that are justified.

McMahan also suggests that by distinguishing between the various aims of punishment, and recognising that such aims can overlap with the aims of defence, we can make a case for punishment as a just cause for war. Punishment can be intended as pure retribution. But it can also be intended to deter future wrongdoing, to prevent future wrongdoing, and to enable restitution to the victims of wrongdoing. Imprisonment, for example, acts as both retribution and prevention, where the retributive element rests upon the idea that the prisoner deserves to be imprisoned. War "is too blunt an instrument" to dish out punishment to those (and only those) who deserve it (p. 84). But given the multi-faceted nature of punishment, McMahan argues that acts of war can still be punitive in character even if they lack the element of retribution. We could, says McMahan, have a "practice of punishment that would have as its sole aim the defense of innocent people against those who, by violating the laws, had shown themselves to be presumptively dangerous and simultaneously made themselves liable to defensive action" (p. 81). Thus, "even if we rejected the idea that violators [of laws] could deserve to be punished, we could still insist that only those who had violated the law could be legitimately punished because only they would be morally liable to punishment" (p. 81).

McMahan is surely right that there is a distinction between liability and desert and that there are acts of punishment that are simultaneously defensive. But I'm not sure that these distinctions add up to the claim that there can be a practice of punishment with solely defensive aims. One can be liable to defensive harm that one does not deserve, for example if one innocently threatens someone else's life. But I don't see how one can be liable to punishment that one does not deserve. When we lock up the dangerously insane, the fact that they do not deserve it (despite being liable to it) removes the punitive aspect of detention whilst retaining the preventative aspect. This seems to me a purely defensive act precisely because the diminished responsibility removes the element of desert, and therefore of punishment. Similarly, I don't see why the defence of people against those liable to be preventatively harmed should be labelled a practice of punishment, if the aim is purely defensive and justified on grounds of liability rather than desert. So, even if McMahan has shown that wars of aggression can in fact be justified, I don't think he has (yet) shown that punishment can be a just cause for war.