Weakness of the Will in Renaissance and Reformation Thought

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Risto Saarinen, Weakness of the Will in Renaissance and Reformation Thought, Oxford University Press, 2011, 248pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199606818

Reviewed by Keith D. Stanglin, Harding University


The subject of this study in the history of philosophy and ethics, the "weakness of the will," is rooted in the ancient Greek concept of "akrasia," which has been translated into Latin as "incontinentia" and "impotentia" and into modern English as "unrestraint," "moral weakness," and "lack of self-control." Akrasia obtains when a weak-willed individual, or "akratês," acts against his or her better judgment. One of the primary philosophical questions at stake is whether the akratic person does wrong knowingly. What exactly lies behind and motivates such irrational behavior? Thus, historically, this topic entails a discussion of faculty psychology and the role of the intellect and will in wrongdoing.

In this sequel to his Weakness of the Will in Medieval Thought: From Augustine to Buridan (1994), Risto Saarinen takes up the question of akrasia in the period from 1360 to 1630. His first volume put to rest the common notion of earlier scholarship that there were no significant discussions of akrasia in the Christian West after Augustine. This latest volume challenges the similar claim that akrasia was not a relevant philosophical problem in the modern era before the rise of analytic philosophy. Like the former volume, this book focuses on the reception history of Aristotle's and Augustine's treatments of the weakness of the will. Saarinen sorts through the works of these often neglected early modern authors and clarifies, summarizes, distinguishes, and classifies their respective views on akrasia. He concludes that weakness of the will was indeed "the source of lively debates and significant innovations," and that this study "sheds light on the general understanding of the human condition" in the early modern period (3).

Chapter One provides a précis of the ancient and medieval discussions regarding akrasia, bringing the novice up to speed on the historical antecedents of the book's theme. Saarinen begins with Plato, who in Protagoras describes Socrates' opinion that agents "always choose what they think best," thus placing the problem of wrongdoing in the intellect and ruling out the commonplace view of akrasia. In Republic, however, Socrates seems to allow for a genuine conflict between reason and desires in which the desires may overcome the higher parts of the soul (7-8). Plato therefore passes on an ambiguous legacy with regard to akrasia. Aristotle contributes a significant discussion of the issue in book VII of Nicomachean Ethics, introducing the practical syllogism, whose conclusion necessitates a specific action (as opposed to a merely intellectual affirmation). Since the akratic person acts against the required outcome of the practical syllogism, Aristotle assumes there must be some defect in the agent's general knowledge (for example, everything sweet ought to be tasted) or in the specific claim of the minor premise (this is sweet). Although Aristotle's view may be classified as akrasia, it is not yet the so-called "clear-eyed" akrasia in which the agent possesses all the relevant knowledge and acts against better judgment (10-11).

In addition to Aristotle's foundational treatment of akrasia, Saarinen describes the "Stoic-Augustinian" model of akrasia which, in contrast to the Aristotelian focus on the practical syllogism, introduces the concept of free consent as the cause of akratic action. The figure of Medea provides a classic example of this knowing assent. In Euripides' account, Medea, who is about to kill her own children, says, "I know what evil I propose to do, but anger rules my deliberations." In Ovid's narrative, Medea, driven by her desire for Jason, says, "I see the better and approve it, but I follow the worse." Expressing a similar sentiment, St. Paul writes, "I do not do the good that I desire, but the evil that I do not desire -- this I practice" (Romans 7:19). After a discussion of various medieval Aristotelian and voluntarist accounts of akrasia, Saarinen provides a chart that summarizes his typology of the positions and their distinctions (42). The positions may overlap in some areas and are not mutually exclusive, but the table is meant to indicate significant distinctions among the options.

After introducing these ancient and medieval antecedents, Saarinen plunges into the new material of the early modern discussions. He is well aware that Renaissance philosophers cannot be separated from Reformation theologians as if there were no common ground. All the figures in question were adept in both the philosophical and theological concerns of their day, and they could not expound one set for very long without reference to the other. For the sake of structure, however, Saarinen divides the book into three main chapters that handle figures from the Renaissance (Chapter Two), the Lutheran Reformation (Chapter Three), and the Calvinist Reformation (Chapter Four).

Chapter Two examines eight authors: Petrarch, Acciaiuoli, Versor, Wellendorffer, Lefèvre, Clichtove, Mair, and Piccolomini. Most of these figures are self-consciously in doctrinal continuity with Thomas Aquinas, though they come out with varying degrees of emphasis on intellectualism and voluntarism. Saarinen is careful to note throughout the chapter how they both carry on and modify the medieval positions they inherited.

Chapter Three begins with a survey of Luther's teachers, including Usingen and Staupitz, and then moves on to examine Luther, Melanchthon, Camerarius, Golius, and Heider. The explicitly Augustinian anthropology of Luther and others results in a view of Christians as "agents who are neither perfect nor completely malicious" (118). Even the regenerate St. Paul's good deeds were tainted by the flesh. The best that a spiritual person can do is "not consent to evil" (120). Among these Lutheran thinkers, there is a more conscious "perception of conflict and remaining uncertainty" that is thought to become the cause of akrasia.

Chapter Four treats the views of Calvin, Zwinger, van Giffen, Daneau, Case, and Keckermann. Similar to their Lutheran counterparts, these Reformed theologians and philosophers are united in their central belief that even the life of the saints is characterized by a struggle and that, consistent with their comparatively pessimistic anthropology, imperfect or incomplete virtues (such as mere continence instead of the more perfect temperance) "are the best we can hope for" (200).

The conclusion (Chapter Five) offers a nice summary of the findings. Among the broad developments, Saarinen observes the discipline of theological ethics slowly emerging and distinguishing itself from philosophy (215). Daneau's Ethices Christianae (1577) is groundbreaking in this regard. Saarinen also notes that, with the influence of Reformation anthropologies, there is a decreasing dependence on describing akrasia by means of syllogistic structures and an increasing use of the metaphors of a pugna or lucta between the flesh and spirit, the desires and reason (217-18). In addition, he returns to the original table of models (42) which distinguishes the various options on akrasia, now classifying these early modern figures under their respective positions (217). The good intention behind the chart is worthy, but the fact that each writer's position is unique and eclectic -- and therefore difficult to classify -- calls the utility of the chart into question. For example, several writers are listed under multiple categories (Keckermann's name appears under four different options). Finally, two sections of epilogue trace the impact of the academic discussions of akrasia. The first epilogue argues that Shakespeare consciously employed these treatments of akrasia in Troilus and Cressida, and the second shows how Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz built their views of akrasia on the developments that immediately preceded them.

In this book, Saarinen provides a fascinating and in-depth study relevant to philosophical and theological anthropology, as well as to the Christian discussion of hamartiology. His nuanced treatment also breaks down the dichotomies that older scholarship posited between philosophy and theology, Renaissance and Reformation, humanism and scholasticism. It highlights the creative and eclectic nature of this intellectual period -- there are no pure "Aristotelians" or "Platonists" or "Stoics," but Christian philosophers and theologians who liberally but critically employed the resources of the past to shape and refine their Christian moral theology. Although it was not strictly within the scope of the book, one could hope for more indications of how these ideas have played out in late modernity. Nevertheless, Saarinen's exposition of these early modern intellectual developments illumines assumptions about the human condition that still dominate in the West. No longer do we see individuals primarily as good or evil only, but we more often depict the ambiguity of the wrestling or struggle typical of human nature; as Luther put it, simul iustus et peccator. Akrasia is the common experience of Western humanity and a well-known theme of its literature and culture, from Medea to St. Paul to St. Augustine to Stevenson's Jekyll and Hyde.

Because of its attention to occasionally rarefied concerns found in detailed texts by several neglected writers, some of whom defy easy categorization, Saarinen's book would not be the best way to introduce a beginner to the topic of akrasia. But his contribution deserves the careful consideration of historians and philosophers who are already familiar with the topic and interested in the evolution of these discussions.