What Am I? Descartes and the Mind-Body Problem

Placeholder book cover

Almog, Joseph, What Am I? Descartes and the Mind-Body Problem, Oxford University Press, 2002, 139pp, $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-514646-8.

Reviewed by Tom Vinci, Dalhousie University


Part I: Almog’s Interpretation of Descartes

This book is written in the tradition of analytical reconstructions of historical texts. In this case Almog is doing more than simply adopting a Cartesian perspective and then writing his own treatise on the mind-body problem, and yet he is also not just recounting what Descartes says. Sometimes what more is involved is a matter of finding “clear blueprints” (71) in Descartes’s texts on how to fill in an account that Descartes himself does not provide; in other cases it is a matter of using formal schemas to represent arguments Descartes seems to be relying on but does not formally lay out;1 in others it is a matter of importing contemporary theoretical apparatus in metaphysics and philosophy of language to illuminate (by the author’s lights) the issues themselves and assist with our assessment of how well Descartes is handling them. Our question in the first half of this review is not, however, how well Descartes handles things, but how well Almog handles Descartes.

My judgment is somewhat mixed. Many of the issues that Almog discusses from the “sophisticated” perspective of present-day metaphysics (chiefly Kripkean) will be ones that philosophically-minded historians will want to grapple with in their quest to understand and assess Descartes’s thought. Almog handles this side of his work well. The apparatus of reconstruction – chiefly formally laid out argument schemas and numbered lists of assumptions and premises – provide enough detail to see the logical structure of Descartes’s arguments, without the effect of sand-in-the-eyes. That said, there is a lot of apparatus employed and the reader will need to pay attention to keep it all clear. Especially helpful, then, are the numerous summaries, clear, short and non-technical, at the beginning of chapters and sections designed to bring along a reader who may have momentarily lost the thread.

However, the fundamental question must be whether the interpretation works: is what Almog lays out, with all this exactitude, really Descartes? Having often been the recipient of “this-is-not-Descartes” assessments of my own efforts in Cartesian scholarship, I am reluctant to make the same assessment here. And yet when we see, for example, that Almog’s account of Cartesian Integrative Dualism not only does not entail the immortality of the soul, but logically precludes it (98, n16) (and this because Descartes apparently maintains that the mind and the body necessarily co-exist, 59) it takes considerable effort even for me not to shout: “THIS IS NOT DESCARTES.” Nevertheless, I recommend making the effort. There is much to be learned here about one end of the range of possible interpretations of Descartes’s none-too-clear thoughts on the nature of human beings and the relationship between the mind and the body. There are also original interpretations of some of the standard texts, for example, the piece-of-wax discussion in Meditation II. Finally, and most important, this book accords to Descartes the kind of serious philosophical study that his thought deserves.

I now turn to a detailed consideration of Almog’s reconstruction of Descartes’s argument for the real distinction between the mind and the body. Descartes’s central metaphysical and logical commitments in this argument – the subject of Almog’s first chapter – are discussed in relation to a class of three arguments he claims to find in Descartes’s texts. The arguments all share the following structure:

(1) Descartes’mind (DM) bears F
(2) It is not the case that Descartes’ body (DB) bears F
(3) DM is not identical to DB ((2), DD)
(4) DM can exist without DB (from (1)) (5-6)

(“DD” is a version of Leibniz’s law, the Distinctness of Discernibles)

Two versions are of main interest to Almog, The Argument from Possibility and The Argument from Whatness. I begin with the former.

The Argument from Possibility (p.7)

(1P) DM possibly exists without DB
(2P) It is not the case that DB possibly exists without DB
(3) DM is not identical to DB
(4) DM can exist without DB

Almog adds to this (and the other schemas) an epistemological principle, which, he says, Descartes might use to establish the first premise formulated as follows:

Real possibility projection: Whatever is (clearly, distinctly and completely) conceivable about a given subject x is really possible for x (11).

Combining the argument with the projection principle, we get the following account of Cartesian reasoning. First, Descartes conceives clearly and distinctly that his body and his mind can exist without one another. This leads to ascribing to DM a modal property: possibly exists without DB. Then, by the first three steps in the Argument from Possibility, Descartes concludes that DM is not identical to DB. This is not quite enough, however, to establish Descartes’s conclusion, viz. that there is a real distinction between the mind and body. That requires the fourth step, a claim of the “existential separability” of DM from DB.

Descartes clearest and canonical statement of his views on the nature of distinctions occurs in Principles I, 60-64. There Descartes characterizes a set of three distinctions: “real distinctions,” “modal distinctions” and “conceptual distinctions.” He seems to say that all distinctions give rise to numerical diversity: “Now number, in things themselves, arises from the distinctions between them”. But there is, he says, more to the idea of real distinctions than numerical diversity, illustrating the point in the subject matter of present interest:

…even if we suppose that God has joined some corporeal substance to …a thinking substance so closely that they cannot be more closely conjoined, thus compounding them into a unity, they nonetheless remain really distinct. For no matter how closely God may have combined them, the power which he previously had of separating them, or keeping one in being without the other, is something he could not lay aside; and things which God has the power to separate, or to keep in being separately, are really distinct.2

The chief textual source for the claim that existential separability is needed (in addition to numerical diversity) for the real distinction between DM and DB lies in passages such as these, where God’s power to “keep one in being without the other” is asserted. Now, Almog does not think that on the most suggestive reconstruction (his own) Descartes is committed to actual existential separability3 though he thinks that Descartes is committed to some kind of existential separability, even if it is an ersatz version.4

Almog’s case that Descartes is not committed to the real separability of the mind and the body is made in two stages. In the first stage he argues that Descartes rejects the projection principle, thus does not infer from the conceivability of the separation of mind and body – which he does accept – to the real possibility of the separation. This does not, of course, show that it is impossible for the mind and the body to be separated. This conclusion is reached in the second stage of the argument, the stage where Almog makes the case that the standards of union that Descartes places on the union of mind and body are so high that they imply a necessary coexistence of Descartes’s mind and his body in the whole human being that is Descartes. This is Descartes’s “Integrative Dualism” which Almog develops in Chapter II.

The first stage of this argument rests on an account of the exchange with Arnauld in the Fourth Objections and Replies. Arnauld had complained that in places5 Descartes seemed to be saying that because he was unaware (doubtful) of anything belonging to his essence other than thought, that nothing else did in fact belong to his essence. Arnauld pointed out respectfully that this did not follow.6 One could not, for example, reason analogously as follows:

I clearly and distinctly perceive…that the triangle is right-angled; but doubt that the square on the hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other two sides; therefore it does not belong to the essence of the triangle that the square on its hypotenuse is equal to the square in the other sides.

In his reply to this, Descartes, of course, accepts the point about triangles but denies the analogy to the mind-body case. In this reply Almog finds three important properties of Descartes’s metaphysics. The first is a rejection of the real possibility projection principle: even if I can conceive of a triangle existing without the Pythagorean property, it still may be impossible for it to so exist. The second is a commitment to the idea that, (1) if F pertains to what x is (F is an essential property of x), F is modally necessary for x (WC), but that the converse, (2) If F is modally necessary for x, F pertains to what x is (CWC), is not true.7 For example, suppose that what is essential to the number 3 is X. X, whatever it is, explains why 3 is distinct from 4 and from 2, why 3 is bigger than 2 but smaller than 4, etc. This essence is, of course, necessary to 3. But the fact that 3 is necessarily the number of dimensions in a Euclidean space is not part of 3’s Cartesian essence. Call this the “Modal Asymmetry Thesis”.

What makes the essence of something a “Cartesian Essence” is the necessary connection between essences and the way we conceive something when we clearly and distinctly understand it. This is the third important property of Cartesian metaphysics represented by the following projection principle:

(Coherent story projection) Whatever is (clearly, distinctly, completely) conceivable about a subject x is logically consistent with what it is and attributable to x in a coherent story (model) about it (14).

The combination of this principle with the Modal Asymmetry Thesis allows for a story that (1) is consistent with how I conceive of something (consistent with its essence) but nonetheless (2) posits states of affairs that are not metaphysically possible. This, Almog thinks, is just what Descartes is doing when he constructs imaginary experiments in which he conceives of himself as existing (or his mind as existing) but his body as not existing. Although (according to Almog) this is a state of affairs that Descartes accepts as not really possible, the conceivability of it allows for the ascription of a property to Descartes’s Mind that is not also applicable to Descartes’s Body:

We may put this argument in a form analogous to that displayed by the possibility and conceivability arguments. That is, DM bears the property consistent-with-what-it-is-to-not-be-extended; DB does not bear this property. Thus DM and DB are numerically distinct (38).

We are not quite finished, however, for Descartes also insists on some form of existential separability to add to numerical distinctness to yield a real distinction between DM and DB. This is where a whatness-consistent story comes in. The whatness-consistent story in this case is the story of conceivable existential separability. Notice that although this story ascribes no property to DM that is inconsistent with its essence (non-extension), the story does in fact assert a metaphysically impossible state of affairs, viz., the mind existing separately from the body. The whatness-consistent tale of existential separability adds the final condition needed to turn the numerical distinctness of DB and DM into real distinctness. Put all this together and you have what Almog calls The Argument from Whatness.8

I have just indicated where a whatness-consistent story of existential separability appears in Almog’s account. Where, if at all, does it appear in Descartes’s? Almog is characteristically frugal in his reference to Cartesian texts but does seem to have one in mind here: the passages in Meditation II beginning where Descartes asks for the first time, “What am I?”9

The story there unfolds in two parts: first there is the establishing of what my essence is. This is accomplished by a kind of subtraction from my properties of all those that are inessential. In the second stage, I tell a whatness-consistent story of the existential separability of my body and me. (This is one of the places where Almog sees an affinity in Cartesian method with Kripke’s. Descartes puts his finger on himself and constructs possibilities around the essence of that individual. Kripke puts a rigid designator on an object and constructs possibilities around it. In neither case do we proceed by locating a pre-existing set of properties from which we construct possible worlds combinatorially and then look to see whether we (the object) might be in one. The difference is that, with Descartes, the possibilities need not be metaphysically real, with Kripke they are.)

In the second part of the book (Chapters 2 and 3), Almog tries to show that Descartes has not proved too much: it is still possible for Descartes to make it out that “man” (understood by Almog as “human being” – a being essentially with a body) is not just a union of mind and body, but a “real man” – a substance in its own right with which mind and body (also substances in their own right) are fully integrated. To make this case, Almog presents a novel reading of the piece-of-wax discussion in Meditation II and revisits the Fourth Replies, finding there, in Descartes’s account of a complete thing, a possible basis for a conception of substance that does not require real existential separability. The question whether Descartes’ “real man” (a human being) is a primary substance in its own right is questionable to me,10 but I shall not pursue the point directly here. Rather, I shall take what space remains for me to argue that Almog has misconstrued the nature of Descartes’s argument for the real distinction between the mind and the body.

Part II: Debating Almog

After proving that he exists in Meditation II, Descartes asks two questions in rapid succession: “What did I formerly think I was?” Answering, “A man” and “What is a man?” Almog thinks that Descartes means by “man”, “human being”, a being which, even for Descartes, is essentially embodied.11 I dispute this. Recall that on Almog’s own reading of Descartes, the essences of things are the clear and distinct conceptions we have of things, so embodiment is a part of the Cartesian clear and distinct conception of human beings. So if ’man’ meant for Descartes ’human being’ then, by Almog’s own lights, essential embodiment would be a part of our clear and distinct understanding of man. But this is exactly what Descartes denies, and attempts to disprove, in the subsequent argument. (Note that I am not arguing here that Descartes denies that there is in fact a necessary connection between the mind and the body – that would beg the question against Almog – but that Descartes denies that extension is a part of the Cartesian essence of whatever he understands a man to be.) So ’man’ does not mean ’human being’.

What does it mean? My suggestion is that it means ’person’. A person may, of course, turn out to be a human being, thus a being essentially embodied, but that is the controversy to be settled, negatively, in the subsequent argument. So our questions are: “What am I?” (I, the specific person who I am) and “What is a person?”. Now, we may ask what metaphysical type the term ’person’ designates in this context. There are two choices I propose to consider: (1) a substance-type, (2) a property-concept. I think that Descartes would choose the latter. Here is one text from the Fourth Replies that suggests this:

We do not have immediate knowledge of substances, as I have noted elsewhere. We know them only by perceiving certain forms or attributes which must inhere in something if they are to exist; and we call the thing in which they inhere a substance.
But if we subsequently wanted to strip the substance of the attributes through which we know it, we would be destroying our entire knowledge of it. We might be able to apply various words to it, but we could not have a clear and distinct perception of what is meant by those words.12

The doctrine seems to be this: (with the possible exception of first person reference to myself) reference to substances is achieved indirectly, by tracking the things satisfying property sets associated with the words. Later Descartes calls the means (earlier identified as properties) by which we know substances, “concepts”: “…there is no one who has ever perceived two substances by means of two different concepts without judging that they really are distinct.”13

So, we shall say that Descartes is asking two questions at the outset of the mind-body argument: “What am I?” and “What is the concept of personhood?”. Much of the subsequent discussion (running from 17-19 in CSM II) seems to be an answer to versions of the former question: “But what shall I now say that I am…?”, “What else am I?”, “But what then am I?” Descartes’s answer is given in terms of what he thinks is essential to him:

Thinking? At last I have discovered it – thought; this alone is inseparable from me. I am, I exist – that is certain. But for how long? For as long as I am thinking. For if it could be that I totally cease from thinking, I should totally cease to exist.14

What is Descartes’s method here? Almog says that the method is one of subtracting inessential properties. How do we decide when we are left with just the essential ones? Almog’s position is that there is simply a primitive instinct for detecting essences on our part; we do not detect them by the method of imaginative experiments. And yet in this passage there is at least the suggestion of that method – if I try to imagine a situation in which I am not thinking (imagine what it would be like not to be in any mental state), and in which I, nonetheless, exist, I cannot do so. Hence, it is impossible for me to exist and yet not be thinking; hence thinking is part of my essence. But if we try to apply the method of counterexamples to the question whether material properties may not also be a part of my essence, the fatal objections from Arnauld assert themselves, objections which (here I agree with Almog), Descartes himself accepts, indeed explicitly asserts a few lines later in the argument.15

The Kripkean objection to the method of counterexamples, applied to individual substances or natural kinds, is that while this method depends on our conception of things, the things themselves may have necessary properties that are not revealed in our conceptions. But this same problem does not, of course, arise if we apply the method only to our conceptions, for example, in providing analytical definitions of them. In such cases the method of counterexamples works just fine. This, I think, is just the method Descartes has employed with the concept of personhood. If I am right about this, it helps explain why Descartes repeatedly insists that he can just tell by inspection what his essence is. For example, this is what he says at the outset of the Fourth Replies:

…I will begin by pointing out where it was that I embarked on proving how, from the fact that I am aware of nothing else belonging to my essence (that is, the essence of the mind alone) apart from the fact that I am a thinking thing, it follows that nothing else does in fact belong to it.16

If we take this as a claim about his own essence as an individual substance, the assertion of the transparency of essence to awareness made here falls foul of the Kripkean objections mentioned before. But if we read this claim as a claim about his essence as something falling under the concept of personhood, and understand the latter as a claim about the set of logically necessary and sufficient conditions of personhood, then what Descartes says is plausible and consistent with the other things that he has said on the subject.

Notice that saying that we can know the complete set of necessary and sufficient conditions for a concept does not entail that we know all of the logical implications of the concept. This is as true of the concept of personhood as it is of the concept of a triangularity. How, then, can Descartes be so sure that the concept of personhood does not imply something physical? That is a good question, one which we will be in a position to answer only after a consideration (following below) of Descartes’s official theory of properties given in the Principles.

I have maintained that in his question “What is a man?” posed at the beginning of Meditation II, Descartes has raised the question about the proper definition of the concept of personhood.17 In his question “What am I?” he has raised the question of his own essence as an individual. My suggestion is that in the argument of Meditation II Descartes shifts (perhaps unwittingly, certainly with acknowledgement) from trying to answer the latter question to trying to answer the former. The shift is consummated in the following passage:

But what then am I? A thing that thinks. What is that? A thing that doubts, understands, affirms, denies, is willing, in unwilling, and also imagines and has sensory perceptions.18

My suggestion is that we understand the words ’what then am I?’ to mean ’What then am I as a person?’ (i.e. as something satisfying the concept of personhood) and see Descartes answering it with a set of logically necessary and sufficient conditions for the concept personhood arrived at by applying the method of counterexamples. It is in aid of this that Descartes’s imaginative experiments are being conducted, not, as Almog would have it, in aid of establishing premises (1) and (2) of the Argument from Possibility.

The set of properties in this list are all, let us suppose,19 mental properties, all modes of thought. Descartes assumes that modes of thought are not modes of extended things, not material properties. This is something he does not argue for in the Meditations; he just takes it for granted. There is now an easy proof that all of his essence as a person consists of immaterial properties. The proof is this.

(1) I am essentially a person. (established as a primitive fact about my essence)
(2) The concept of personhood is logically equivalent to a set of exclusively mental properties (method of counterexamples)
Therefore, (3) The only essential properties I possess as a person are exclusively mental properties.

(I am also an individual substance but as an individual substance no corresponding proof is available.)

All very well one may say (I hope) but how do we get from here to the conclusion that Descartes’s mind and body are really distinct? Descartes’s answer in the Fourth Replies is that “for establishing a real distinction it is sufficient that two things can be understood as ’complete’ and that each one can be understood apart from the other.” And there immediately follows a definition of ’complete thing’: “a substance endowed with the forms or attributes which enable me to recognize that it is a substance”.20 Of course, one wants to know how this is possible, that is, how from the attributes of something we can recognize that it is a substance.

Rozemond has recently argued that Descartes’s answer is to be found not in the text of the Meditations or the Replies, but in the official doctrine of properties developed in Principles I, 53 ff. According to this doctrine, properties form a hierarchy in which specific properties are treated as determinate modes of less specific properties, all of which are modes of an ultimate determinable property, an attribute. Attributes serve as the defining characteristic of the family of properties, which they subserve. Descartes, of course, thinks that there are two such families, one with the defining attribute thought, the other with the defining attribute extension. Substance comes into the account twice, first in article 63, then in article 64.

Article 63 says that when we are thinking of mind and matter in general, mind and matter are substances, which are virtually indistinguishable from their attributes. The difference is only a “conceptual difference”, one that seems not to lie in the things themselves. So when it comes to substances conceived generally there is one attribute to one substance and one substance to one attribute. Rozemond calls this the “Attribute Premise”.21 Knowing Descartes’s theory, one could then infer from a set of properties drawn exclusively from modes of thought, that they inhere in a substance distinct from that in which a set of properties drawn exclusively from modes of extension inhere. Since the first substance is mind-in-general, and the second matter-in-general, in the presence of the Attribute Premise we have the immediate result that mind-in-general and matter-in-general are distinct substances. We also have a possible answer to the question pending from before: how can Descartes be so sure that there are not unknown physical implications deriving from the concept of personhood? The answer would have to be a closure principle to the effect that logical implications derivable from a set of properties, all of which fall within a given attribute family, must also fall within that family.

Some recent commentators22 have thought that that is that: now we have Descartes’s proof that the mind is distinct from the body. Unfortunately, this view (the ’simple view’) does not take into account Descartes’s discussion of individual substances (Descartes’s mind, Descartes’s body for instance) in Article 64. In these cases, attributes do not bear the same relation to substances that they do in the case of mind and matter in general. In Article 64, attributes are just modes of the individual substances. (According to Descartes, the distinction between a substance and a mode is not a mere conceptual distinction, but has a category of its own, “modal distinction”.) Moreover, the Attribute Principle does not hold in the case of individual substances – there is not just one individual mind corresponding to the single attribute, thought. So Descartes cannot infer by this principle that his set of purely intellectual properties inheres in one individual substance, that his set of purely physical properties inheres in another individual substance, and that the two substances are really distinct from one another. A fortiori, he cannot show that he is identical with an individual mind or that he is a combination of an individual mind with an individual body.

What he can show is something hypothetical. If God were somehow to annihilate all of my physical properties while preserving in existence what other properties (i.e. mental properties) I may possess, there would still remain a set sufficient for its bearer to count as a person by the definition proposed in Meditation II. Apart from whatever else may follow, this is an important result for the purpose of proving the possibility of the immortality of the soul. But it may be possible to derive just from this hypothetical possibility the conclusion that the mind and the body are really distinct from one another on Descartes’s definition. The argument would go somewhat as follows:

The set of properties definitive of personhood would, if actualized by themselves by God, be modes of a substance, thought-in-general. This is because all of these properties are modes of thought and thought and mental substance in general are in reality the same. Analogously, if the set of properties definitive of the human body were actualized by themselves by God, they would be modes of a substance, matter-in-general. It follows that my set of person-defining mental properties and my set of body-defining properties are things which God has the power to separate into two substances, mind-in-general and matter-in-general.

And this pretty much fits the definition of the real distinction of the mind and the body from Principles I, 60.23


1. See, e.g., those on 5-7.

2. Following Almog, my source for quotations is J. Cottinhgam, R. Stoothoff, D. Murdoch, and (Vol. III only), A. Kenny (trans. and ed.) The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, Volumes I, II and III (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984-1991). See CSM I, 213.

3. One would expect, therefore, that dealing with these texts would be high on Almog’s list of priorities. Yet it is not, nor does he grapple with the related doctrine of the creation of the eternal truths that has so mystified Descartes’s commentators. (pp. 14-15) Yet the texts in which Descartes says God can keep the mind in being while destroying the body and the doctrine of (metaphysically) necessary co-existence can be reconciled if the power that God uses to effect the separation transcends what is (metaphysically) possible. Indeed, there is a hint in a text from the Sixth Meditation dealing with God’s power to separate mind and body, that the power employed is the extraordinary one. At CSM II, 54 Descartes says that the “question what kind of power is required to bring about such a separation does not affect the judgment that the two things are distinct.”

4. This is given in the Whatness Argument.

5. E.g. in Discourse IV, CSM I, 127, and Meditation II, CSM 18.

6. Fourth Objections, CSM II, 140

7. 15. Almog does not cite a text in which Descartes draws a distinction between some necessary relations that are constitutive of what we can conceive of a thing - that are part of its essence- and some necessary properties that are not necessary for our conceiving the thing, and thus fall outside its essence. The following may be such a passage: although we can clearly and distinctly understand that a triangle in a semi-circle is right-angled without being aware that the square on the hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other two sides, we cannot have a clear understanding of a triangle having the square on its hypotenuse equal to the squares on the other sides without at the same time being aware that it is right-angled (CSM II, 158)

8. It is offered schematically on p. 7, fleshed out on p. 38.

9. CSM II, 17

10. One ground for questioning this assertion in the text of the Fourth Replies itself is that, whereas Descartes, quoting from his First Replies, refers to each of the mind and the body as “an entity in its own right which is different from everything else” (my emphasis) he refers to the human being as a “unity in its own right”. It is clear that Cartesian human beings are a unities of a high order owing to the special relation that unites the mind and the body - in a letter to Regius Descartes even calls this a “substantial union” (CSM III, 209) - but that that does not amount to a claim on Descartes’s part that human beings are primary substances. (See also Marleen Rozemond, Descartes’s Dualism (Cambridge.: Mass., Harvard University Press, 1998)) Yet that is what Almog claims.

11. Fourth Replies, CSM II, 157

12. CSM I, 156

13. CSM II, 159

14. CSM I, 18

15. And yet may it not perhaps be the case that these very things which I am supposing to be nothing, because they are unknown to me, are in reality identical with the ’I’ of which I am unaware? I do not know, and for the moment I shall not argue the point…(CSM II, 18)

16. CSM II, 154

17. A Kripkean would object that ’man’ is a natural kind term and that the same gap between concept and essence applies here as it does in the case of an individual. Perhaps, but I see no evidence that Descartes accepted a doctrine of natural kinds. For him the only real substances are individuals -- natural kinds are part of the Aristotelian framework he found so discreditable.

18. CSM II, 19

19. There is some question about those of sense perception and imagination but I set it aside here. See my discussion of this in, Tom Vinci, Cartesian Truth (Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, 1998), 31-39.

20. CSM II, 156

21. Rozemond, Descartes’s Dualism, 24 ff.

22. Notably, Rozemond, Descartes’s Dualism, Chapter 1.

23. The passage is quoted here on p. 3.