What Are We? A Study in Personal Ontology

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Eric T. Olson, What Are We? A Study in Personal Ontology, Oxford University Press, 2007, 250pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0195176421.

Reviewed by Michael O'Rourke, University of Idaho


"Understanding the questions," writes Eric Olson, "is the hardest thing in philosophy" (6). This is especially true of questions like, "What are we?"  It is with questions like this that we need the most help, and this impressive volume makes real progress toward providing an answer. Olson focuses on personal ontology, or "our basic metaphysical nature" (iv), seeking clarity about "our most general and fundamental features" (3).  His book is rigorously argued and its scope comprehensive. Anyone interested in ontology, the metaphysics of composites, or the nature of persons and the self would do well to spend time with it.

In What Are We?, Olson seeks to clarify the question featured in his title by closely considering a range of prominent answers. He begins with a chapter that carefully scrutinizes the meaning of the question, and then moves through seven chapters each dedicated to one of the following possible responses: we are animals, material things constituted by animals, brains, temporal parts, bundles, souls, and nothing (i.e., we do not exist, appearances to the contrary). Rather than convince the reader that a certain answer is correct, he aims to supply a careful map of the logical space of answers, albeit one with the hazards clearly marked. The final, concluding chapter asks, "What now?", and leaves us with a "bold conjecture" that, if true, would conceptually constrain the space of acceptable answers.

Any book built around a question had better spend some quality time analyzing it, and Olson discharges this responsibility in the first chapter. Perhaps it won't come as a surprise, but he believes the question must have an answer, although one that might lie beyond our reach. Pursuit of the answer will certainly be fruitless if we fail to distinguish this question from others that resemble it, such as questions about the nature of mentality or the persistence conditions that underwrite judgments of diachronic personal identity. More subtly, Olson argues that we must not take "people" (using this as the plural of 'person' for stylistic reasons) to be an adequate answer to his principal question. As he sees it, "the claim that we are people tells us nothing about our metaphysical nature" (8). "People" may not be the answer, but it is clearly an important part of the question, as revealed by the fact that the concept person figures centrally in two preliminary glosses offered in this chapter. First, Olson suggests that the "we" in "What are we?" are "human people," where a human person is a person who "relates in an intimate way to an animal that is biologically human" (10). Second, he rephrases the question in the formal mode and identifies his quarry as "what a human person refers to when he or she says 'I'" (11). Further development of these conditions reveals that he is interested in accounting for the metaphysical nature of human subjects capable of thought and action.

Having identified the "we" in "What are we?", Olson proceeds to speak to the "what" over the course of the next seven chapters. In keeping with his view of the "we", a condition of adequacy on any answer will be that it address the intimate relationship between ourselves and the biologically human animals we see when we look in mirrors. By my count, he considers seven primary answers and nine secondary variants. For the purpose of classifying the primary answers, let's start with a truism: either we're something or we're nothing. If something, we could be material or non-material. On the material side, Olson begins with the proposal that we are simply identical with the biological organisms we look at in the mirror (Ch. 2). If we are not identical with them, perhaps we are constituted by them, much as a statue is constituted by its clay (Ch. 3). In evaluating these proposals, he assumes that we are the things that think our thoughts (29); however, it is possible that only a part of the organism does the thinking. In particular, perhaps we are identical with the brains (or perhaps the central nervous systems) of these organisms (Ch. 4). Alternatively, if we think of the organism as a four-dimensional object, we could be a temporal part, perhaps that part in particular which comprises all psychologically continuous "person-stages" (Ch. 5, 119). On the non-material side, Olson examines the suggestion that we are bundles of mental states or events (Ch. 6), as well as the more traditional and age-old suggestion that we are immaterial substances, or souls (Ch. 7). Oh, to be something! Sadly, though, that isn't a given -- there remains the alarming possibility that, as Olson puts it, "there is no sort of thing that we are" (180). After setting aside concerns that this nihilistic position is mad or self-refuting, he concentrates on the nihilist's attempt to account for the intimate relationship with the animal through different paraphrase strategies (Ch. 8).

Olson's treatment of the primary answers to his question is a model of charitable philosophizing. All of these views are examined respectfully, with careful arguments in favor of the views preceding reservations and objections. The argumentation is dense but readable, and while his previous work establishes him as an animalist (e.g., Olson 1997), you wouldn't conclude that from the discussion in the middle chapters.[1] The arguments supplied are sophisticated and cover a sampling of current discussions of the various options (for example, Olsen adduces temporary intrinsics in support of four-dimensionalism and uses the paradox of increase to motivate immaterialism). Two strands of argument are central to the book; both reflect conditions of adequacy on accounts of personal ontology. First, as noted above, any adequate account must address our intimate relationship with biological human animals, and in particular, what we should make of the fact that these animals seem to think right along with us. Perhaps we are identical with these animals, as animalism suggests? Perhaps the animals think but are different from us in some other, principled way? Perhaps they don't think, or don't think as we do? Or perhaps the animals don't really exist at all? Calling this "the thinking-animal problem," Olson returns to it in each chapter, noting when it proves problematic (Chs. 3, 5, and 6) and when it doesn't (Chs. 2, 4, 7, and 8). Second, an account of personal ontology should supply what we need to address the issue of our persistence over time. Olson addresses what persistence could look like on each of the views, once again using this as a touchstone to determine which views have an advantage (Chs. 5, 6, and 7) and which do not (Chs. 2, 3, 4, and 8).

While the rhetorical tone in the middle chapters certainly conveys a sense of what appeals to Olson, it isn't until the final chapter that he offers his own opinions about the range of alternative answers. After quickly dismissing the brain view and the bundle view, he scratches his chin over immaterialism before setting it aside. The constitution view has its advocates, but Olson sees it as "deeply implausible and, above all, unprincipled" (214). That leaves him with animalism, the temporal-parts view, and nihilism, all of which remain "in the contest". His own allegiance lies with animalism, and he devotes some of this chapter to defending animalism against two trenchant objections. The first of these -- the thinking-parts problem -- maintains that every part of an organism that includes a brain could be said to think in "the strictest sense", thereby creating a problem of determining which of this multitude we are. Applying the clay-modeling puzzle to the animal, the second objection is grounded in the observation that the stuff out of which we're made survives us even though it seems identical to us while we're alive, much as the clay can survive the statue into which it is formed. In the end, though, he doesn't select animalism over the other two options, choosing to remain more circumspect about what is the correct answer to the question. The final few pages are devoted to development and defense of his bold conjecture that our fundamental metaphysical nature and the nature of material composition are closely connected. So long as composition is not simply a brute fact, Olson contends that animalism, the temporal-parts view, and nihilism are each implied by a different theory of composition; this creates a conceptual connection between personal ontology and material composition that "ought to make progress on both easier" (236).

Those expecting a defense of animalism -- a sequel to Olson (1997) -- will not find it here; if anything, this reads more like a prequel, containing circumspect reflections on the metaphysical background against which the problem of personal identity plays out. The prominent position of the animal chapter and the pervasive use of the thinking-animal problem might give a contrary impression, or at least motivate concern that he is stacking the deck against all other answers to his question. If the topic were personal identity, giving such prominence to the human animal would be grounds for suspicion, but as this is a book about personal ontology, putting the human animal out front is to be expected -- after all, wherever I go, there it is. Metaphysics may eventually yield a surprising answer to the question of what I am, but in doing so it will have to either explain or explain away the human animal. More troubling, perhaps, is Olson's reliance on the subjective and the psychological in this book. To answer the question, "What are we?", one must have some sort of provisional fix on what 'we' means. The fix Olson adopts is the human person, which under development looks strikingly like the Cartesian ego. Throughout his study, the "thinking thing" (13) is used as a touchstone to determine if the answer under scrutiny is adequate. It will be difficult to get personal identity without psychology, as Olson (1997) champions, if psychology forms the foundation of personal ontology.

Related to this is a feeling that the person isn't getting a fair shake in this book. This derives primarily from Olson's rhetoric. For example, he tells us that he doesn't find it an interesting question "what it is to be a person" (44). Also, on the assumption that "being rational, intelligent, and self-conscious suffices for being a person" (9), he argues that "persons" (or "people") is not a candidate answer to his question: being a person is unnecessary if we were once fetuses, and it is arguably insufficient if the concept of person covers artificial or supernatural agents. But rhetorical bluster aside, this book concerns personal ontology, that is, the ontology of the human person, and Olson clearly recognizes the centrality of the person to this topic. The pages of this book are shot through with mention of persons and personhood, as they should be. He realizes that to find adequate answers to his question, he must look in the space where biological humanity intersects psychological personality. It may not itself be an adequate answer, but psychological personality is an essential part of the question and so constrains any answer that has a chance to be correct. No acceptable account of what we are will fail to speak to the overriding appearance that we are rational, reflective agents, that is, persons.

Also troubling for those who do not share Olson's opinions is the quick work made of four candidate answers in the final chapter. There are reasons given in earlier chapters that support this move, but it is not obvious that they tell against their targets any more cogently than those adduced against Olson's three finalists. It is clear that he is interested in developing his conjecture about those three answers, but failure to provide real reasons in dispatching the other four threatens to vitiate it. The conjecture looks like a robust result if you narrow your focus to those three, but if you don't, it will likely just be one pattern among many -- a constellation rather than a conclusion.

Finally, one might argue that one of the strengths of this book -- the clarity with which it lays out the case for and against each position on personal ontology -- is also, ironically, one of its biggest weaknesses. The logical space of alternatives is clearly marked, leaving us with an understanding of what we must believe if we are to commit to any of them. He dispenses with options he finds unbelievable, but not because they are logically disqualified. Others with different metaphysical sensibilities will certainly disagree with his dismissive treatment of the four views he rejects in the final chapter. By the end of the book, we know where Olson stands, but others will stand in different places with arguments that are not obviously inferior. Where does this leave us? Perhaps when it comes to this (as in any metaphysical) topic, the proof of the pudding is in the eating; however, it's not at all clear that one variety of pudding will taste any better than any other. Perhaps as the final chapter suggests, the question cannot be answered in isolation but is rather part of a broader cluster of metaphysical questions that must be addressed together. This might give us the leverage we need to move toward the answer Olson believes this question must have, but at this point it looks just as likely that any answer could be had so long as one is willing to make the necessary holistic adjustments. As much as we might want this question to have an answer, at what point do we begin to doubt whether it has an answer, or worse, whether it is even well-formed in the first place?

These concerns should not be allowed to occlude my principal judgment: this is a good book. Its philosophical sophistication and rigor should recommend it to anyone working on the metaphysics of persons, and its scope and readability should recommend it to anyone teaching metaphysics to upper level undergraduates or graduate students. Whether or not this is a question with an answer, accompanying Olson on his trip through the logical space it carves out is enjoyable and rewarding.[2]

[1] Olson, E. T. 1997. The Human Animal: Personal Identity Without Psychology. New York: Oxford University Press.

[2] Thanks to my colleague, Matthew Slater, for assistance with this review.