What is Good and Why: The Ethics of Well-Being

Placeholder book cover

Richard Kraut, What is Good and Why: The Ethics of Well-Being, Harvard University Press, 2007, 279pp., $ 35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0674024419.

Reviewed by Michelle Mason, University of Minnesota


What is Good and Why: The Ethics of Well-Being is the first book-length contribution to contemporary ethical theory by this highly regarded scholar of ancient philosophy. With it, Richard Kraut joins recent moral philosophers who draw inspiration from ancient Greek philosophy, particularly that of Plato and Aristotle, to advance lines of thinking that challenge utilitarianism and certain forms of neo-Kantianism in ethics.[1] Kraut defends two central theses. His "developmentalism" about well-being holds that something is (non-instrumentally) good for a person just in case it is productive or part of human flourishing, i.e., productive or part of the "maturation and exercise of certain cognitive, social, affective, and physical skills" (p. 141). Kraut defends a complementary thesis in the theory of practical reason, "That there is just one legitimate route -- the route of goodness -- for arriving at practical conclusions" (p. 15). Aiming in this way to secure a link between his account of well-being and conclusions about how we should act, Kraut lays the foundation for a "good-centered" ethical theory that he opposes to utilitarianism, on the one hand, and Rawlsian contractualism, on the other. Against the utilitarians, Kraut objects to quantifying value along a single measure and to emphasizing maximization as the proper response to value. Against Rawls, Kraut argues not only that the case for the purported priority of the right over the good ultimately rests on a false conception of goodness but also that moral rightness, understood as introducing a category of reasons distinct from and superior to those that advert to goodness and badness, "does not exist" (p. 29).

Kraut's argument spans 71 sections divided among four chapters. Chapter One, which upon first encounter may appear hastily argued, is best approached as a précis of Kraut's project. Chapter Two homes in on the sense of "good" that serves as the focus of Kraut's theory of well-being and which occupies the ultimate justificatory role in his account of practical reasoning (which he defends in Chapter Four). Chapter Two also takes up competing conceptions of human goodness, and ranges over the meta-ethics of Moore and Ross to contemporary conative theories of well-being, in order to reveal their inadequacies. This clears the way for Kraut's defense, in Chapter Three, of what he calls a "developmental" theory of well-being. Kraut concludes in Chapter Four by arguing that considerations pertaining to goodness (as his theory of well-being construes it) exhaust the considerations that bear on what one should, all things considered, do. Throughout, Kraut's method is self-consciously Aristotelian in searching "for ways to refine and systematize the opinions of the many (common sense) and the wise (philosophers) and seek[ing] the resolution of disagreements within and between these groups" (p. 137, n. 8). Kraut's aim in this book is ambitious and his discussion wide-ranging. I focus here on what I take to be his main ideas.

Kraut begins by noting the centrality of evaluations of goodness in our deliberations. Pursuing a point made familiar by Peter Geach, Kraut argues that "S is good," while grammatical, is unclear as to its meaning. Geach famously concluded that "there is no such thing as being just good or bad, there is only being a good or bad so-and-so."[2] While Kraut joins Geach in rejecting Moore's (and Ross') focus on what is good sans phrase, Kraut departs from Geach in allowing that "S is good" is appropriately used to express not just (1) goodness of a kind ("S is a good K") but, also, (2) goodness that a certain state of affairs obtain, event occur, or action be performed ("It is good that P"), and (3) goodness for an artifact or living thing ("G is good for S"). Kraut suggests that claims of type 3 enjoy a certain priority, although it is not always clear what sort of priority Kraut intends.

We cannot answer whether S is a good K, on Kraut's view, without appeal to some standard of flourishing. That seems to me correct so far as living kinds are concerned. In such cases, arguably it is what it is for Ks to flourish as Ks that determines whether S is a good K. That is, whether a particular ficus is a good ficus will turn on whether it is flourishing as a ficus: Are its leaves dying off? Are its roots rotting? And so on. Yet, in a particularly confusing passage Kraut writes: "A good dog is one who serves some human good -- who is good for someone. A good wolf is one who acts in a way that is good for that wolf or for other members of his pack" (p. 270). The fact that the dog is a domestic animal hardly seems sufficient to motivate the difference in treatment. A cat genetically modified to be hypoallergenic might be good for me but that doesn't suffice to determine whether it is good qua cat -- to determine the latter, we must look to whether it is doing well by the standards of flourishing feline life. Neither is it necessary that S contribute to human flourishing for S to count as a good one of its kind. An especially virulent virus might be a good instance of its kind while posing a fatal threat to human flourishing ("Now that's a good virus!" the scientist exclaims, as she places her new sample under the microscope, discarding a previous, less virulent, sample). Thus, when Kraut concludes that "Good poetry, good wolves, good thieves, and good people are all good in the same way: in all cases, some contribution is made to what is good for someone, and that is what supports the judgment that S is a good K" (p. 270), we should resist the suggestion that it is S's contribution to human flourishing that is the ultimate determinate of whether S is a good K. Instead, as Kraut correctly urges elsewhere, we should keep separate the evaluation of an individual as a good instance of its kind and its evaluation as a contributor to human flourishing. (Of evaluating a poem, for example, he writes "Two stages in the evaluation of a poem or a poet should be distinguished: are these words put together poetically? And what is the good of putting words together poetically?" (p. 269))

Although Kraut thus fails to establish that goodness of type 3 enjoys explanatory or conceptual priority over the other types of goodness, he is on stronger ground when he defends the privileged justificatory status of goodness of type 3 in practical reasoning: "All good practical arguments rest on claims about what is good or bad for someone" (pp. 74-75). If it is good that P, then that fact counts in favor of P. However, there must be some reason that it is good that P. On Kraut's view, ultimately those reasons must bottom out in the fact that P is good for someone or other. Likewise, if the fact that S is a good K is to be relevant to choice, then arguably that fact counts in favor of choosing K just in case, ultimately, choosing K is good for someone or other. We should not conflate, however, (1) goodness of a kind with (3) goodness for an artifact or living thing in defending the primacy of the latter so far as human choice is concerned.

What does it mean to say that G is good for some living thing? One might assume that a theory of human well-being must address itself to the perspective of the person whose good is in question. This invites the suggestion that what it means for G to be good for a particular person is for G to be good from that person's standpoint or perspective. At this point, Kraut makes a move likely to be familiar to readers of Foot. Human beings are not the only things for which other things are good, of course. Certain things are good for the other animals and plants. Arguing, as Foot does, that talk of goodness is univocal in meaning across these contexts, Kraut concludes that the perspectival option fails as a proposal about what it means for something to be good for a living thing (p. 94). Plants, after all, haven't a perspective on anything. In place of the perspectival option, Kraut proposes that to say that G is good for a living thing is to "refer to the conformability or suitability of G to S. It indicates that G is well suited to S and that G serves S well" (p. 94). The relationship in question in speaking of what is good for my ficus, good for my poodle, good for my daughter, thus is the same relationship. My ficus, my poodle, and my daughter are different kinds of living things, of course, and thus what stands in the relationship of being well suited to any of them will differ accordingly. What stands in this relationship will likewise be sensitive to individual differences among members of the same kind. Nevertheless, a theory of well-being for any of these living things must attend to the generic properties of the kind of living thing that is in question.

What things, then, are good for human beings in the requisite way? Before Kraut can advance his own substantive proposal -- "developmentalism" -- he attempts to dislodge the substantive dogma that corresponds to the discredited perspectival account of the meaning of "goodness": the conative (or desire) theory of well-being. The conative theory holds that it is a person's "attitudes, emotions, desires, plans, goals and the like" (p. 8) that determine what is good for that person. In an astute diagnosis of such theories, Kraut writes "A remarkable feature of the conative approach to well-being is that it proposes to assess the value of our psychological attitudes without paying attention to their content" (p. 99). Among the objections Kraut raises to such theories, some will be familiar, including the objection that discounting irrational or misinformed desires in favor of the rational and informed is, ultimately, ad hoc. His most fruitful objection, one that hints at his own developmental proposal, proceeds by drawing attention to some particularly damning implications of accepting the conative theory as a general account of what it is for G to be good for S. Considering what is good for human infants and children -- a refreshingly mundane context -- Kraut presents the conative theorist with a dilemma. On one horn, the theory takes the fulfillment of relatively thin psychological states (such as desires) that are plausibly ascribed to the very young, to ground claims about what is good for a person. Although this enables conative theorists to capture the very young within the scope of their theory, it generates implausible candidates for what is, in fact, good for the very young children in question. On Kraut's view, the desires of infants and young children simply are not sufficiently robust and complex to lend themselves to an adequate account of their good. One might add that their objects hardly seem promising candidates. (Spend an afternoon with a toddler and one quickly discovers that she wants, inter alia, to swallow the marble, play with her feces, and throw herself from great heights.) Grasping the other horn of the dilemma, the conative theorist posits more complex psychological states -- plans, goals, and the like. On this horn, however, the conative theorist must abandon the aspiration to a theory applicable to human beings in general: the very young simply haven't any plans or goals of the requisite sort.[3] Of this, many philosophers need reminding: "When parents nurture a young child, they shape her desires, goals, and plans, and they do so for her good… Parents take for granted a developmental story about how it is best for the lives of their children to go as they grow up" (p. 107).

The developmental story that parents (among others) take for granted becomes, in Chapter Three, Kraut's scaffolding for a compelling alternative to conative theories of well-being. Having arrived at the conclusion that what it is for G to be good for S is for G to be well suited for S or serve S well, developmentalism provides the substantive account of just what things are thus suited for, or well serve, human beings. Kraut's central idea here, intimated earlier, is that, for all living things, flourishing is good for them. Kraut's appeal to what it is for a living thing to flourish is an appeal to a "thick" ethical concept that is both empirically rich and normatively significant. The concept's biological implications link it to facts about the development of members of a species; the concept shows its evaluative side once we consider what it would take to claim that flourishing is bad for us (see, e.g., p. 148). Once we grant that it is good for a living thing that it flourish, we can note, quite generally, that living things flourish by "growing, maturing, making full use of the potentialities, capacities, and faculties, that (under favorable conditions) they naturally have at an early stage of their existence" (p. 131). Conversely, "Anything that impedes the development or the exercise of those mature faculties … is bad for them" (p. 131). Turning to the specific case of human beings, what is good for a human being as such will thus turn on facts about human development. Rather than turning to the relevant empirical sciences here, however, Kraut rests content with common sense: "Using the categories of common sense, we can say at least this much: A flourishing human being is one who possesses, develops, and enjoys the exercise of cognitive, affective, sensory, and social powers (no less than physical powers)" (p. 137). These, then, are the general categories that on Kraut's view comprise human well-being.

Although Kraut is careful here to deny a priori appeals to what is good for human beings as such, familiar objections against neo-Aristotelian attempts to ground ethical evaluations in considerations of human nature are sure to raise their head. Here, however, I find Kraut to be on stronger argumentative ground than are some other recent neo-Aristotelians, particularly Foot. Foot's theory of natural goodness and defect, as applied in evaluating human qualities of will as good or bad ones, ultimately appeals to standards derived from facts concerning the teleology of the human species. Foot's case for bridging the resulting gap between the judgment that a particular human being is a good one of her kind and the judgment that it is good for that particular human being that she be a good one of her kind is, at best, under-argued. To be sure, Kraut's developmentalism must attend to many of the species-specific facts to which Foot adverts, but where Foot appears to encourage armchair biology, developmentalism directs us to those human sciences that largely have done the work of bringing species-specific facts to bear on prescriptions for individual human flourishing: developmental and clinical psychology prominent among them. In proceeding directly from thoughts about what is good for a human being -- as opposed to thoughts about what makes a human being a good one of its kind -- Kraut also avoids having to bridge Foot's gap.

How well does the resulting developmental conception of well-being address the practical significance that a person's good is supposed to have for her? It is a purported strength of conative theories of well-being that they capture this significance. If, in telling me that the best life for me is such-and-such a life, you mean to say that that is the life that best answers to my desires, plans, or goals (suitably idealized perhaps), then the relevance between what you tell me and what life I have reason to pursue appears clear. I have a reason to pursue that life precisely because it answers to my (perhaps suitably idealized) desires, plans, or goals. There are familiar problems with this picture; does Kraut do any better? On Kraut's view, the fact that such and such a life is good for me, perhaps the best life for me, means that it is (best) suited to my "growing, maturing, [and] making full use of [my] potentialities, capacities, and faculties, that (under favorable conditions) [I] naturally have." The fact about which life is good for me will be sensitive, of course, to certain peculiarities of my situation. It will be sensitive, for example, to my current stage of life. (What is good for the toddler is not necessarily good for the adult.) Ultimately, however, the facts about what life is best for me are not settled by my conative states and, once we accept that, we must also acknowledge the possibility that "growing, maturing, [and] making full use of the potentialities, capacities, and faculties, that (under favorable conditions) [I] naturally have" holds no appeal for me (or any plausible philosophers' stand-in for my actual self). What, then, are we to make of the practical significance of a person's good on Kraut's conception?

This is a point at which Kraut's endorsement of the ancient thesis that "there is just one legitimate route -- the route of goodness -- for arriving at practical conclusions" (p. 15) proves significant. With this thesis, Kraut proposes to make the connection between, on the one hand, facts about what is good for a person and, on the other, reasons for acting. The consequence of this view of practical reason for the question of how I should treat the consideration that a course of action will contribute to my "growing, maturing, [and] making full use of the potentialities, capacities, and faculties, that (under favorable conditions) [I] naturally have" is this: there is reason to pursue that course of action despite its failing to engage any of my actual or hypothetical desires, plans, or goals.

What I have, all things considered, reason to do is not -- on Kraut's view -- determined solely by the good (or bad) it will do for me but, rather, by considering the well-being of all the potential beneficiaries of my action in light of my relationship to them and other pertinent factors. There is no easy way to say in advance what factors will prove pertinent and the resulting account of practical reasoning does not lend itself to the facile schematization characteristic of some competing views. Nonetheless, Kraut does an admirable job in the fourth and final chapter of the book of applying his theory to a number of practical problems (among them, problems pertaining to promises, retribution, justice, paternalism, slavery, torture, lying, and (even) honoring the dead). In canvassing the different kinds of considerations relevant to how we should act, Kraut notes "Practical reasoning has many tools at its disposal: it properly adverts to what one person owes another person, to considerations of merit, reciprocity, justice, commitment, obligation, duty, responsibility, impartiality, virtue, and so on" (p. 271). The force of his discussion throughout, however, is that the justificatory status of these considerations alike rests on the good (or bad) on offer for those whom the actions affect.

I have noted that Kraut's book is ambitious and wide-ranging. One advantage of these features of the book is that it enables Kraut to measure a certain neo-Aristotelian option in normative ethics against utilitarian and Rawlsian alternatives across a far greater number of dimensions than do other recent works in the book's comparison class. However, these same features of the book work also to its detriment. In particular, they at times preclude Kraut from pursuing his opponents' likely responses or confronting the issue of what motivates the opposing view (and, so, acknowledging what his own alternative gives up). The relevance of his view of practical reason for broader debate in the theory of practical reason is one place where one wishes to hear more. Likewise, even fellow opponents of conative theories of well-being may legitimately worry that Kraut's case against such theories covers objections that are familiar and which, by now, have been met with the desire-theorists' replies. So, too, with Kraut's case against Rawlsian contractualism. This case is compelling, as far as it goes, but Rawlsian constractualism is hardly the only or best representative of a neo-Kantian option in normative ethics (whatever one might think of its prospects for political philosophy). Kant famously held that there is nothing in the world good unconditionally but the good will. Therein lies the seed of an idea that need not follow Rawls's path to the priority of the right to the good but may nonetheless assert the priority of formal constraints on willing over competing considerations pertaining to individual welfare. Kraut has surprisingly little to say about this possibility -- surprising, that is, in light of the prominence of such alternatives, not in light of the book's already broad range.

Given the book's ambitions, some omissions are, of course, necessary. And however one might fault Kraut's particular omissions, the book remains an important contribution to the neo-Aristotelian project in moral theory. In that context, Kraut's work most distinguishes itself for its defense of developmentalism about well-being and in its buck-passing account of moral rightness. The book will reward study by advanced students and scholars (combining it with Foot's Natural Goodness and Hursthouse's On Virtue Ethics, for example, would give one an especially nice trio for study in a graduate seminar). Finally, it is written in a style that, one would hope, might attract an even wider audience.

[1] The natural comparison class for Kraut's book will include, for example, Rosalind Hursthouse's On Virtue Ethics (New York: Oxford University Press, 1999) and Philippa Foot's Natural Goodness (New York: Clarendon Press, 2001).

[2] Geach, "Good and Evil," Analysis, Vol. 17 (1956): 33-42. Geach's arguments were directed against "objectivists," such as G.E. Moore.

[3] Kraut compellingly argues that the move from actual desires, plans, or goals to idealized or hypothetical psychological states is of no help here (see pp. 109-113).