What Place for the A Priori?

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Michael J. Shaffer and Michael L. Veber (eds.), What Place for the A Priori?, Open Court, 2011, 261pp., $44.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780812696608.

Reviewed by Elijah Chudnoff, University of Miami


This volume collects twelve new papers that take up questions about the existence, nature, and scope of a priori knowledge. In general, the papers are narrowly focused entries in standing debates from the contemporary literature. Those looking for introductory or historical discussion should look elsewhere.

The papers collected approach the a priori from a number of different starting-points, for example: psychotherapy, philosophical methodology, naturalism, the conditions for scientific inquiry, and content externalism. Even so, the volume’s contents cluster, for the most part, around three dominant concerns: indispensability arguments, the constitutive a priori, and Casullo’s program.

Indispensability arguments go like this:

Premise 1: We have knowledge about matters such as mathematics, morality, and metaphysics.

Premise 2: We couldn’t acquire this knowledge by empirical reasoning, i.e., reasoning based on sensory perception.

Conclusion: So we acquire it by a priori reasoning, i.e., reasoning not based on sensory perception.

The first two papers – Michael Devitt’s “No Place for the A Priori” and Edward Erwin’s “Evidence-Based Psychotherapy” — agree on premise 1. Devitt cites familiar examples; Erwin argues that psychotherapy depends on value judgments. Devitt rejects premise 2. He defends the Quinean view that empirical support can accrue to beliefs about mathematics, etc. holistically, via their incorporation in a web of beliefs that “faces the tribunal of experience as a corporate body.” Erwin criticizes this response to premise 2. He points out that a weaker premise suffices for the argument:

Premise 2*: We do not in fact acquire this knowledge by empirical reasoning.

The question now is whether Quinean observations about how our beliefs are actually confirmed undermine premise 2*. Erwin argues that they do not. He disentangles moderate theses — e.g., beliefs are confirmed in clusters — from stronger theses — e.g., all of our beliefs form a seamless web. The moderate theses are plausible, but do not threaten premise 2*. The stronger theses threaten premise 2*, but, Erwin argues, are not plausible.

Two other papers touch on indispensability arguments. In “The Philosophical Insignificance of A Priori Knowledge,” David Papineau concedes that a priori knowledge is possible, but assumes that “if there is any a priori knowledge, it is analytic” (p. 61), and develops a conception of philosophical inquiry on which it is a form of empirical reasoning, not a priori reasoning. He briefly considers mathematical and moral claims. He takes both sorts of claims to be neither analytic nor justified on the basis of empirical reasoning. This suggests to me that there is synthetic a priori knowledge. Papineau does not explore this possibility, however, and limits his focus to philosophical methodology. In “A Dilemma for Naturalized Epistemology?” Shane Oakley focuses on epistemic principles. It is important to distinguish two ways in which these might bear on the existence of a priori knowledge, which I’ll call the formal way and the substantive way.

The formal way: the a priorist might argue that empirical reasoning cannot be the only kind of reasoning since then we couldn’t non-circularly justify the epistemic principles that govern empirical reasoning itself.

Oakley rightly points out that if this is a good argument it applies to a priori reasoning as well. Devitt also makes this point in his paper, and notes that in both cases the circularity need only be rule-circularity.

The substantive way: the a priorist might argue that a priori reasoning puts us in a position to give a rule-circular justification for the epistemic principles that govern it, but that empirical reasoning does not put us in a position to do even this much.

Whatever reason there is to believe premise 2 in the indispensability argument would likely be a reason to believe this claim as well, since epistemic principles seem more akin to the claims of mathematics, etc. than to empirical claims.

A number of papers in the volume argue — largely by reflection on scientific methodology — that we must rely on certain beliefs that are not straightforwardly supported by empirical reasoning but that do not answer to traditional conceptions of the a priori. For example, in “Epistemological Empiricism” Harold Brown argues that no belief is immune to empirical challenge but that “coherent scientific research requires something that plays the normative role of synthetic a priori propositions” (p. 151). In “A Reconsideration of the Status of Newton’s Laws,” David Stump argues that our scientific theories are “grounded empirically but still contain functionally a priori elements that cannot be directly tested and without which the theor[ies] could not be stated.” (p. 187) And in “A Priori Conjectural Knowledge in Physics,” Nicholas Maxwell argues that "we have a priori knowledge in the sense of conjectural knowledge accepted on grounds other than evidence, but not in the sense of indubitable knowledge established by reason alone." (p. 215, italics in original)

The beliefs Brown, Stump, and Maxwell focus on are sometimes called constitutively a priori (see p. 193). They are constitutive in that our allegiance to them forms the framework within which empirical reasoning proceeds. They are a priori in that they are presupposed by empirical reasoning, not justified by empirical reasoning. They are different from traditional items of a priori knowledge primarily in that they are not justified by an alternative, non-empirical form of reasoning.

Does the constitutive a priori provide an alternative to the two standard views — the a priorist view that some knowledge is based on a priori reasoning and the empiricist view that all knowledge is based on empirical reasoning? In “The Constitutive A Priori and Epistemic Justification,” Michael Shaffer persuasively argues that it does not. The proponent of the constitutive a priori faces a dilemma. Either constitutively a priori beliefs are the sorts of mental states that are epistemically justified or unjustified, or they are not, being mere conventions. If they are mere conventions, then their existence is compatible with empiricism, since empiricism is a claim about knowledge, which consists of mental states that are epistemically justified. Suppose they are epistemically justified or unjustified. Then either this justification derives from sensory perception or it does not. If it does, then constitutively a priori beliefs are, however different their function from other empirical beliefs might be, based on empirical reasoning, and so, again, empiricism is safe. If their justification does not derive from sensory perception, then constitutively a priori beliefs are based on a priori reasoning, and so a priorism is true. The upshot is that the category of constitutively a priori beliefs might be useful for developing a view of the nature of scientific inquiry, but it does not significantly alter the debate over the existence of a priori knowledge. It should be noted, however, that many of the proponents of the constitutive a priori are more concerned with developing a view of the nature of scientific inquiry — especially one that is empiricist but that departs from Quinean holism (see Stump on p. 188, for example) — than addressing the debate between a priorists and empiricists.

The volume includes two papers — by Anthony Brueckner and Robin Jeshion — that discuss Casullo’s book A Priori Justification, along with Casullo’s reply to them. According to Casullo, a priori justification is justification that does not derive from experience, “nonexperiential justification.” What is experience? Casullo distinguishes between a broad and a narrow usage of “experience”:

Broad: any mental state with a phenomenal character is an experience

Narrow: sensory perceptions are experiences, and intuitions are not, even if both have phenomenal characters

One of his main theses is that “experience” in its narrow usage is a natural kind term, and therefore the nature of experience so understood is to be revealed by empirical investigation, not armchair analysis.

Jeshion focuses on this aspect of Casullo’s project. She argues that “experience” is not a natural kind term. As Casullo points out, her argument depends on the assumption that if “experience” is a natural kind term, it is a term for a physical or biological kind. Casullo’s view, however, is that it is a term for a psychological kind, which might be realized in physically and biologically different ways. Jeshion suggests that “experience” is a functional kind term. Casullo interprets her proposal as follows:

X is an experiential process if and only if X is a cognitive process by which we secure information about the world via causal relations to objects in the world accessed through distinctive conscious phenomenological states (p. 131).

I find his criticisms of this particular proposal persuasive. My overall impression of the debate, however, is that there is room to accommodate elements from both positions — experience can be a functional kind and also be associated with an underlying nature that can only be revealed by empirical investigation.

Consider David Marr’s distinction between three levels at which we might understand an information-processing task: computational, algorithmic, and implementation. Mirroring these levels we might say that experiences serve a certain function, that certain psychological processes carry out this function in humans and creatures with a similar psychology, and that these psychological processes are realized in a particular way in human brains and creatures with a similar biology. What is the function? It seems to me to be one that Casullo considers and rejects: experiences, narrowly understood, serve to make us aware of contingently existing objects, states, and events. One virtue of this proposal is that it groups sensory perceptions, episodes of introspection, and bodily sensations together as experiences, which is proper since none of these are a priori sources of justification. If we ignored the functional level and focused on the psychological level, however, it is unlikely that we would find a kind that groups sensory perceptions, episodes of introspection, and bodily sensations together. Casullo rejects this proposal because (i) it rules out the possibility of immediate experiential justification for beliefs about abstract objects or immediate a priori justification for beliefs about contingently existing objects, and (ii) it fails to explain how the justification for beliefs about abstract objects differs from the justification for beliefs about concrete objects.1 But (i) is not an obvious consequence — some bridge from claims about awareness to claims about immediate justification is required — and, given that it is about immediate justification and not justification in general, seems plausible anyway, and (ii) seems to me to impose an explanatory burden on views about the nature of experience that they need not bear.

Another of Casullo’s main theses is that determining whether we have any a priori knowledge also depends on empirical investigation. Suppose intuitions are the putative sources of nonexperiential justification. Casullo’s idea is to assess the epistemic credentials of intuition by investigating the psychological processes that are involved in it. If it turns out that they reliably cause true beliefs about their target domain, say mathematics, then a priorists will be vindicated. Brueckner and Casullo take up various concerns about the enterprise. One concern is that even if it takes empirical investigation to determine the reliability of the psychological processes involved in intuition, there are various epistemic questions about intuition that might best be pursued from the armchair. As Brueckner points out, for example, there are questions about epistemic relevance of reliability, and hence of the envisioned empirical inquiry, that do not themselves seem answerable by empirical inquiry.

In “Terror of Knowing,” Ümit Yalçin discusses a cluster of issues familiar from the literature on content externalism and self-knowledge. Consider the following argument:

1. Oscar knows without epistemically depending on his senses that he is thinking that water is wet.

2. Oscar can know without epistemically depending on his senses that his thinking that water is wet entails that there is water in his environment.

3. Therefore, Oscar can know without epistemically depending on his senses that there is water in his environment.

Should we be troubled by this argument? Maybe not. One traditional empiricist project is to prove the existence of the external world on the basis of premises about your own mental states. If you’re an empiricist of this sort, then, Yalçin suggests, you should embrace (3). Two observations. First, most traditional empiricists thought that we must epistemically rely on sensory experiences to establish claims about the external world. Second, most traditional empiricists endorsed a phenomenalist view of the external world. Yalçin does not discuss how these additional aspects of traditional empiricism bear on the acceptability of (3).

1 See Albert Casullo, A Priori Justification, Oxford University Press (2003), p. 152.