What's Left of Human Nature?: A Post-Essentialist, Pluralist, and Interactive Account of a Contested Concept

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Maria Kronfeldner, What's Left of Human Nature?: A Post-Essentialist, Pluralist, and Interactive Account of a Contested Concept, MIT Press, 2018, $45.00 (hbk), 301pp., ISBN 9780262038416.

Reviewed by Phillip Honenberger, University of Nevada, Las Vegas


In 1986, philosopher of biology David Hull initiated a new phase of discussion about human nature among philosophers of science (Hull 1986). Maria Kronfeldner's book masterfully engages and reorients the post-Hull treatment of this issue. She begins from the widely accepted view that many features of traditional concepts of human nature are non-starters. Biology since Darwin has steadily delivered reasons to reject many traditional theses about human nature, including:

  1. All humans have a common intrinsic essence, a human "nature" that explains why they behave and function as they do.
  2. There are some features of behavior or physiology that are universal to, and unique to, humans (or, "necessary and sufficient" for membership in the kind "human").
  3. There is an empirically sound basis for a normatively significant distinction between the normal and abnormal in human lives.

Rather than infer directly from the failure of these theses to the eliminativist conclusion that Hull favored, Kronfeldner takes pains to identify whatever can legitimately and usefully be preserved of the human nature concept.

A central organizing principle of Kronfeldner's account is a distinction between three kinds of "natures" that we can assign to humans (likewise, other species): classificatory, descriptive, and explanatory. These can also be understood as three separate conceptual functions that a human nature concept can serve. A classificatory human nature concept says what is required for something to be a member of the class "human." A descriptive human nature concept says what human beings are like. An explanatory human nature concept uses human nature to explain something, such as a particular human being's behavior. These have often not been distinguished as they should. Traditional essentialists, for instance, took essences to fulfill all three roles.

After an introductory chapter, the book divides into three parts. Part I summarizes three common arguments against the concept of human nature. Chapter 2 considers the normative and political argument that the human nature concept has often been used to dehumanize and devalue those "abnormal" humans who don't fit its specifications and therefore should be abandoned. Chapter 3 reviews the classic anti-essentialist argument from Hull, Sober, and others. According to these arguments, biology since Darwin has come to understand species as populations and lineages characterized by wide-ranging variation and contingency in their characters. They therefore do not have the character-based necessary and sufficient conditions of membership (Hull 1986), nor universally present characters that would allow for universal predictions of their members' physiology and behavior (Sober 1980), that are assumed by essentialist concepts of species' natures. Chapter 4 reviews the "interactionist" argument from developmental systems theorists and others to the effect that no sense can be made of a human nature as opposed to or distinct from nurture or culture because these kinds of factors cannot be distinguished for any principled reason within evolutionary and developmental processes.

Part II develops reconstructed versions of human nature concepts that can survive the anti-essentialist and interactionist arguments. (Discussion of the normative argument is reserved for Part III.) Chapter 5 sets the stage for Part II by carefully distinguishing between different senses of "human nature," including the aforementioned breakdown into classificatory, descriptive, and explanatory natures. Kronfeldner then argues that genealogy -- understood here in phylogenetic terms, that is, as branches of the evolutionary tree -- can and does provide a legitimate basis for a classificatory human nature (93-102). Genealogy both tells us what are the boundaries of the human species and gives a rule for deciding which individual organisms are members of the species. By answering the classification question, genealogy thereby also establishes a reference class for descriptive and explanatory natures, something they both require (116). But Kronfeldner also perspicuously acknowledges that the privilege ascribed to genealogy in contemporary biological classifications (that is, relative consensus in favor of phylogenetic species concepts) is a contingent feature of the history of science and could conceivably change in the future (117-119).

The next two chapters address the defensibility of a concept of descriptive human nature. These chapters engage with the most active disputants in the post-Hull human nature debate, such as Machery (2008, 2016), Ramsey (2013), Lewens (2012, 2015), Stotz (2010), and Griffiths (2011). A starting point for most participants in this debate, following Machery (2008), is that Hull was right that an essentialist human nature that fulfills both classificatory and descriptive roles (to use Kronfeldner's terminology) is inconsistent with a modern biological understanding of species and evolution, but that the concept of human nature need not be wedded to such essentialism. In particular, one can drop the essentialist requirement that traits defining human nature be true of all and only humans. Yet the replacement notions on offer vary widely. Machery (2008, 2016) defends what he calls a "nomological" concept of human nature. This defines human nature as those attributes that are (a) typical of human beings (understood basically as "true of most human beings") and (b) results of evolution.

Lewens (2012) and Ramsey (2013), on the other hand, criticize Machery's typicality requirement by pointing to the variability within all species, including humans, as exemplified for instance by stable polymorphisms such as male and female or the various blood types. They also point to the arbitrariness, from the standpoint of contemporary evolutionary biology, of setting the "typicality" threshold at any particular percentage. Should an attribute that is part of human nature be 51% typical, or 99% typical, or what value in between? In addition, Lewens and Ramsey challenge Machery's requirement that any proposed component of human nature be due to evolution. As an alternative to these requirements of Machery's account, they propose to identify human nature more broadly with the full range of traits held by members of Homo sapiens. Thus Lewens and Ramsey defend very inclusive theories of human nature that don't require universality (à la Hull), typicality, or evolvedness. Ramsey (2013) explicitly identifies human nature with the total pattern of traits characterizing members of the species in all their variety.[3]

Critics of views like those of Lewens and Ramsey -- including Machery and Kronfeldner -- argue that they are too inclusive. A result of Ramsey's view, for instance, is that skiing and being a Sikh are parts of human nature (Lewens 2015: 79). The claim that such things are part of human nature, say the critics, stretches our intuitions and folk-commitments about the human nature concept too far. In order for the human nature concept to play anything like the descriptive and explanatory role that it plays within the sciences and popular discourses that employ it, attributes that count as part of human nature must be both attributable to most people (in Kronfeldner's terminology, both typical of current humans and stable through evolutionary time) and be rooted in biological evolution rather than merely the relatively less stable processes of individual learning and development.

In yet another alternative, Stotz (2010) and Griffiths (2011) defend a developmental systems account of the human nature concept that agrees with Lewens and Ramsey in rejecting the privileging of biologically evolved traits (contra Machery), due to the causal and conceptual inseparability of "biological" and "cultural" factors within development and evolution. The developmental systems account agrees with Ramsey in identifying human nature with the total pattern of traits but emphasizes that these patterns are features of a developmental system.

Kronfeldner makes at least three noteworthy and original moves in these debates. First, she defends a deeper pluralism than perhaps any of these parties have to this point, noting the variety of ways that human nature concepts may be important to various sciences or inquiries. This pluralism includes the aforementioned distinction between classificatory, descriptive, and explanatory natures, as well as further sub-distinctions within each (based on what one is interested in or what and how one wants to explain).

Second, she handles the issue of typicality and polymorphisms differently from both Machery and Ramsey through a clever use of the notions of disjunction and of abstraction. By disjunction one can turn any attribution of a range of variable states to humans (each of which fails to meet the "typicality" requirement) into a substantively equivalent claim about human nature in general (thus, typically). For instance, asserting that some humans are male, others are female, and still others are intersex as evidence that gender is not typical can be challenged by reframing the assertion as the disjunctive "Human beings are either male or female or intersex." This disjunctive claim is one that does hold true for human beings typically. One can further rephrase the disjunctive claim in a more abstract form as "Human beings are sexed," a statement that no longer bears traces of the originally recognized variety. Candidate polymorphisms can thus always in principle be redescribed as typical traits and, in the other direction, candidate typical traits can be redescribed as polymorphisms.

This raises the question of why one should favor a particular level of abstraction in any particular description or explanation. Kronfeldner answers that question pluralistically and pragmatically. Different fields may have uses for descriptions at different levels of abstraction. "[T]here is no a priori argument on where abstraction has to stop nor any general empirical rule where to stop" and "[a]ny actual abstraction stopping will involve pragmatic decisions" (137).
[4] Thus, "The debate between Lewens, Ramsey, and Machery cannot have an a priori general philosophical solution" (138). In our explanations we always focus on some differences as targets of explanation while abstracting from others -- for instance, examining the difference in average human height between the medieval period and the 20th century (while abstracting from sex differences), or (conversely) examining the difference in average heights between human males and human females (while abstracting from -- or more likely controlling for -- the century in which the data was collected). The former would allow us to identify cultural causes of height differences while the latter would allow us to identify genetic causes of height differences. Kronfeldner uses this framework to distinguish between explanations by biological factors and explanations by cultural factors (71, 157-164). Each abstracts from or disjunctively recognizes a different set of differences.

Third, in Chapters 7 and 8, Kronfeldner argues for a revised version of Machery's "evolved" requirement for human nature attributes. First, she emphasizes that this should more precisely be understood as "biologically evolved." According to a position she calls "channelism," there are two channels of transmission in human history: biological and cultural. According to Kronfeldner, the biological channel tends to be more stable than the cultural because the former is almost always vertical (parent to offspring) whereas the latter can be vertical, horizontal (peer-to-peer), or oblique (elder non-parent to younger non-offspring) (102-111). Partly because of this greater stability, and partly because of the conventional association of "human nature" with that which is not culturally transmitted (155-156, 165), she argues that human descriptive and explanatory nature ought to be restricted to that which is biologically transmitted.

In Chapter 9, Kronfeldner provides an analysis of causation that helps to explain and justify her position on explanatory human nature concepts. This analysis is developed from a survey of solutions to the problem of "causal selection," that is: Given that the full panoply of causes in play in any system is enormous, how do we, as putative explainers, select the causes that we take to be relevant to our explanations? Kronfeldner shows that Collingwood, Hesslow, and others were aware of this problem and provided a range of similar but slightly varied solutions, which she collects and synthesizes in the notions of a causal reference class and an explanatory background and foreground. Near the end of the chapter she points to the possibility of explanatory looping effects. These are like Hacking's descriptive "looping effects", but for explanations.

Part III addresses the normative dimensions and implications of human nature concepts. In Chapter 10 Kronfeldner argues for a double-entry condition into "humanity" (signifying the domain of entities deserving of special moral status in such institutions as "human rights"). The double-entry condition counts as "human" anyone (1) who belongs to the species in the sense of the genealogy-based classificatory nature described in Chapter 5, and (2) anyone who is "similar enough to [other humans] . . . to interact [with them] in morally and politically adequate ways" (218). Each of these conditions is individually sufficient. The former condition includes members of Homo sapiens sapiens that are unable to participate in the human moral community (such as severely cognitively disabled humans); the latter condition includes humanoid robots, highly educated apes, intelligent extra-terrestrial life and other special cases, insofar as such meet criterion (2) and thus pose the challenge of our moral obligations towards them.

Kronfeldner then evaluates proposals that human nature has direct implications for morality. She rejects the "normative essentialism" of authors such as Philippa Foot and Michael Thompson, due to its incompatiblity with the arguments against essentialist species-nature concepts laid out in Chapter 2. Yet she also argues for the defensibility of "internalist humanism" -- that is, efforts to develop a catalogue of moral commitments through reflection on what states or conditions made possible by human nature we want to affirm and support, as exemplified by Martha Nussbaum's work. Kronfeldner further argues that such "normative" human nature is an "essentially contested concept" in the sense of Gallie (1956), whose paradigm examples of such concepts were "art," "democracy," and "Christianity." This would mean the concept has at least the following features: it is important to us; we don't expect controversies about its meaning to ever be fully resolved; yet conversation and debate about its meaning is in some sense beneficial for us.

In Chapter 11, Kronfeldner returns to the question that, in a way, started the entire post-Hull debate about human nature: Should the human nature concept be eliminated? Surprisingly, Kronfeldner ultimately argues that things would likely be better if we could drop the term and concept of "human nature" from our practices. The reasons cited are the scientific non-necessity of the term and concept (alternatives are available such as "genealogically-defined species" and "typical and stable characters of the genealogically-defined species"), the epistemic obfuscation that is risked by its continued use, and the negative normative and political effects that have historically, and can easily continue to be results of its use -- particularly dehumanization and discrimination against the "abnormal."

The synoptic quality of Kronfeldner's text makes it a landmark contribution to the human nature debate among contemporary philosophers of biology. The typology of human nature concepts into classificatory, descriptive, and explanatory; the novel articulation and defense of pluralism; the address to both epistemic and normative issues; and the breadth and depth of its review of the literature on the topic since Hull's 1986 essay can be expected to serve as enduring contributions to the discussion of these issues going forward. Nonetheless, several threads of Kronfeldner's account hold less tightly than the others.

For example, there is the worry that the concepts of "abstraction" and "disjunction" are themselves too abstract to capture the complexity of material relations between typical and diverse features of the human species. There are relations between attributes like "speaking a language" and "speaking Japanese" that are more complex than one being a more general description of the other. (Compare the relations between "having height" and "being 110 cm tall," or "being sexed" and "being female.") How a particular attribute is related to a more general attribute that it instantiates or exemplifies is relevant to how relations between "natural" and "non-natural" aspects of human life and action are understood. I don't believe this point is technically inconsistent with anything Kronfeldner has said, but it points to the fact that it will often be necessary to go beyond logical categories like inclusiveness and exclusiveness, or generality and particularity, in order to make sense of controversies and claims about specific attributes. And, as Kronfeldner usefully acknowledges in her pluralism, which distinctions and groupings are relevant will vary depending on the perspectives characteristic of different fields and research traditions.

Another issue arises in the handling of relations between nature and culture, particularly in restricting descriptive and explanatory human nature to that which is biologically inherited. Kronfeldner's main proposed reasons for this restriction are (1) the (proposed) greater typicality and stability of biologically transmitted attributes and (2) the conventional association between "biology" and "nature," both of which are sometimes opposed to "nurture" or "culture." There are problems with both reasons. Regarding the first: the claim will of course only apply to some subset of biologically transmitted attributes, and this raises the question (mentioned earlier in connection with criticisms of Machery's views) of what threshold of typicality or stability is sufficient for inclusion of an attribute in human nature, and why. Furthermore, some culturally-transmitted attributes (such as Kronfeldner's own example of burying the dead [154-156]) may be as typical and stable as many biologically-transmitted attributes, raising the question of why they shouldn't be included in descriptive or explanatory human nature concepts. Regarding (2), one worries that the question is being begged. Who's to say the conventional understanding isn't simply inadequate, even incoherent? Then views like those of Stotz (2010) and Griffiths (2011), which reject the association of human explanatory nature with what is only biologically transmitted, may be stronger than acknowledged.

The worry about channelism is related to the worry about abstraction because the danger in both cases arises, it seems to me, from a limitation of method. One might like to circumscribe "biological" descriptions and explanations on the basis of formal criteria like stability and typicality, but it's plausible that biology and the world are too messy for such a procedure to work in every case. Some developmental and evolutionary processes may strain the limits of this framework. See, for instance, Levinson and Dediu (2013) on the interplay of genetic and cultural factors in the evolution of linguistic competence.

Philosophical discussions of human nature have long afforded opportunities to develop insights of a highly scientifically, existentially, and politically significant kind -- the kind having to do with we humans and our place in the world. Kronfeldner's work is a laudable addition to this tradition.


Gallie, Walter. 1955. "Essentially contested concepts." Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 56: 167-198.

Griffiths, Paul. 2011. "Our Plastic Nature." Pp. 319-330 in Snait B. Gissis and Eva Jablonka (eds.), Transformations of Lamarckism: From Subtle Fluids to Molecular Biology. MIT Press.

Hull, David. 1986. "On Human Nature." PSA: Proceedings of the Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association 2: 3-13. University of Chicago Press.

Kronfeldner, Maria, Neil Roughley, and Georg Toepfer. 2014. "Recent Work on Human Nature: Beyond Traditional Essences." Philosophy Compass 9/9: 642-652.

Levinson, Stephen C. and Dan Dediu. 2013. "The Interplay of Genetic and Cultural Factors in Ongoing Language Evolution." pp. 219-232 in Peter J. Richerson and Morten H. Christiansen (eds.), Cultural Evolution: Society, Technology, Language, and Religion. MIT Press.

Lewens, Tim. 2012. "Human Nature: The Very Idea." Philosophy and Technology 25: 459-474.

Lewens, Tim. 2015. Cultural Evolution: Conceptual Challenges. Oxford University Press.

Machary, Eduoard. 2008. "A Plea for Human Nature." Philosophical Psychology 21 (3): 321-329.

Machery, Eduoard. 2016. "Human Nature." pp. 204-226 in David Livingstone Smith (ed.), How Biology Shapes Philosophy: New Foundations for Naturalism. Cambridge University Press.

Ramsey, Grant. 2013. "Human Nature in a Post-essentialist World." Philosophy of Science 80 (5): 983-993.

Sober, Elliott. 1980. "Evolution, Population Thinking, and Essentialism." Philosophy of Science 47 (3): 350-383.

Stotz, Karola. 2010. "Human nature and cognitive-developmental niche construction." Phenomenology and the Cognitive Sciences 9: 483-501.

[1] See also Kronfeldner et al. (2014) for a statement of this distinction.

[2] Although Machery doesn't specifically say biological evolution, this is clearly what he intends.

[3] Lewens (2015: 64-80) usefully labels the options "eliminative" (Hull), "disciplined" (Machery), and "libertine" (Ramsey).

[4] At the same time, Kronfeldner notes, there must be abstraction to some extent or else general claims would be impossible, and abstraction must be stopped at some point or else human nature claims would be so general as to be effectively empty.