Where the Conflict Really Lies: Science, Religion, and Naturalism

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Alvin Plantinga, Where the Conflict Really Lies: Science, Religion, and Naturalism, Oxford University Press, 2011, 359pp., $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199812097.

Reviewed by Paul Draper, Purdue University


"There is superficial conflict but deep concord between science and religion, in particular theistic religion, and superficial concord but deep conflict between science and [ontological] naturalism." Alvin Plantinga repeats this formulation of his thesis several times in the book. Unfortunately, on the book jacket the last three words are changed from "science and naturalism" to "naturalism and religion," which makes the sub-thesis of deep conflict appear rather easy to defend. I mention this mistake as a service to all those critics of the book who appear to have read little more than the book jacket. (In all seriousness, the fact that some of these irresponsible critics are philosophers is disturbing.) Even Plantinga's formulation of his thesis is slightly misleading, since it suggests that he will defend four existential statements when in fact his first and third sub-theses are universal statements. Stated less concisely but more precisely, his thesis is that (i) all alleged conflict between science and theistic religion is superficial, (ii) there is deep concord between science and theistic religion, (iii) all alleged concord between science and naturalism is superficial, and (iv) there is deep conflict between science and naturalism. I will argue later that Plantinga has a fifth sub-thesis that is left unstated and that his fourth sub-thesis is actually less ambitious than this formulation suggests.

Plantinga does not use these four sub-theses to organize his book, though the book does coincidentally have four main parts. Six of the book's ten chapters are devoted to the first sub-thesis, which, reworded one more time, says that no alleged conflicts between science and theistic religion are both genuine and substantial. His defense of this claim is divided into two parts, corresponding to the first two parts of the book, which he calls "Alleged Conflict" (that is, alleged conflicts that are not genuine) and "Superficial Conflict" (that is, alleged conflicts that are genuine but only superficial). In "Alleged Conflict," he argues that two alleged conflicts are not real. The first, which is discussed in the first two chapters of the book, is the alleged conflict between evolution and theistic religion.

Plantinga's definition of "evolution" includes an ancient earth, the appearance of increasingly complex life forms over time, and descent with modification from a common ancestor. Sometimes he adds what he calls "Darwinism," which is the thesis that the principal mechanism driving evolutionary change is natural selection operating on random genetic change. Although Plantinga clearly accepts evolution in his narrower sense, he seems to be skeptical of Darwinism[1]; but whatever credence he gives to it, his strategy is not to challenge it. Instead, he tries to show that, even if it is true, it does not conflict (either logically or probabilistically) with theistic religions, including or especially Christianity.

For the purposes of this book, Plantinga equates Christianity with something similar to the set of beliefs that C. S. Lewis called "mere Christianity," and crucially includes in this definition, not just the doctrine that human beings are created in God's image, but an interpretation of that doctrine according to which it implies that humans resemble God by virtue of being persons who can understand and know things about ourselves, the world, and God. Three implications of this definition are worth mentioning. First, it classifies as non-Christian all those Christians who don't believe that God is literally a person. Second, on this definition, Christianity does not imply a young earth or six literal days of creation or anything else that is obviously incompatible with the deliverances of science. Third, as Plantinga points out, this definition suggests that there is at least some concord between science and Christianity because it suggests that the success of science is a striking yet unsurprising development of theimago dei in humanity.

Returning to the issue of whether there is conflict between Darwinian evolution and theistic religion, one part of that issue is the question of whether the claim that evolution is Darwinian (and so involves random genetic change) conflicts with the claim that it is "guided" -- that is, planned or otherwise directed or shaped by some personal agent. Plantinga (unlike Darwin) interprets the issue as a conceptual one and in particular as one whose answer depends on how properly to define the word "random" in the relevant biological sense. Plantinga does not offer his own definition, but instead appeals to the definitions offered by two experts, the biologist Ernst Mayr and the philosopher of biology Eliot Sober. On Sober's definition, genetic change is random unless some physical mechanism detects which mutations would be beneficial and causes those mutations to occur. That certainly leaves a lot of room for God's involvement. For Mayr, genetic change is random if (roughly) it is not correlated with the adaptational needs of an organism. On this definition too, it is possible for all mutations to be random even if God regularly and miraculously causes beneficial mutations for the purpose of bringing into existence creatures of the kinds he intends. Plantinga doesn't say how this is possible, but it is easy to see that it is. For example, God could miraculously cause additional mutations that are not beneficial or prevent other mutations that would have been beneficial -- whatever it takes to prevent a positive correlation between the production of new genotypes and the satisfaction of adaptational needs.

There are, I suspect, plausible analyses of the term "random mutation" according to which mutations caused by God specifically for the purpose of increasing fitness would not be random. But even if one of those is the "correct" definition, that wouldn't show that guided evolution couldn't be Darwinian. As Plantinga points out, an omnipotent and omniscient God who created all of nature including its laws could influence the direction of evolution in a variety of ways. Directly causing mutations precisely for the purpose of increasing fitness would hardly exhaust the available options. Nor would such a God's remaining options all involve selection that is not "natural" in the relevant sense. Further, even if a God occasionally used options incompatible with random genetic change or natural selection, that too would be compatible with Darwinian evolution because Darwinism only claims that natural selection operating on random genetic change is the principal mechanism driving evolutionary change, not the only mechanism. (This is why the shaping of evolution by those "personal agents" we call breeders clearly does not disprove Darwinism, even though the selection involved there is not "natural" in the relevant sense.)

One concern I have about the first two chapters of the book is that Plantinga is too quick to dismiss the idea that there might be probabilistic conflict or tension between Darwinian evolution and theistic religion. He emphasizes the fact that an omnipotent God could have created in a variety of ways, many of them incompatible with the truth of Darwinian evolution. If naturalism is true, however, it's hard to see how the complexity that we observe in the living world could have come about (in the time available) if natural selection did not in many cases gradually direct evolutionary change towards increased complexity. Given this and given Plantinga's defense later in the book of the principle of indifference, he seems to be committed to the conclusion that the truth of Darwinian evolution is antecedently many times more likely given ontological naturalism and our background knowledge than it is given theism and our background knowledge. Since Plantinga does not want to limit "conflict" to "logical incompatibility," it seems that he should take this probabilistic argument much more seriously than he does, especially since some structurally similar arguments are judged by him to provide non-negligible support for theism in the part of the book on concord between science and theistic religion.

A related point concerns Plantinga's rejection near the end of chapter two of the claim that evolution makes the problem of evil worse. He dismisses this claim partly on the grounds that we don't need evolutionary biology to see that there are many horrific evils in the world. This is true, but that only shows that evolution doesn't make the problem of evil worse by lowering the likelihood of the facts of evil given theism. Plantinga never considers the possibility that Darwinism, by serving as a sort of naturalistic "a-theodicy," might make the problem of evil worse by raising the probability of the facts of evil given naturalism.[2] One might object that if Darwinism accounts for these facts when it is combined with naturalism, then it accounts for them just as well when it is combined with theism. I believe this is false. Darwinism is a much better atheodicy than a theodicy for several reasons, but here I will simply point out that Plantinga can't consistently raise this objection if he is skeptical about Darwinism and if that skepticism is based in large part on his theism, for that commits him to the view that Darwinism is more likely to be true given naturalism than given theism, which is itself a reason to prefer a naturalistic Darwinian account of the facts of evil to a theistic Darwinian account.

In chapters three and four, Plantinga considers a second allegation of conflict. Many members of theistic religions believe that God directly acts in the world, for example, by performing miracles. It is often alleged that this belief conflicts with contemporary science, that a proper respect for the success of modern science implies a "hands-off theology." Plantinga offers two main reasons to believe that this conflict is not real. The first is that scientific laws only tell us what happens in a causally closed system. Thus, they are compatible with direct divine action since such action implies that the relevant system, namely the universe, is not closed. (Plantinga maintains that causal closure of the physical world is a philosophical add-on to science, not a part of science itself.) A second reason that direct divine action is compatible with a scientific understanding of how the world works is that the laws of quantum mechanics are probabilistic. Thus, quantum mechanics doesn't determine a specific outcome for a given set of initial conditions. It only assigns probabilities to a variety of possible outcomes. So a God's choosing which outcome occurs in a specific case need not violate those laws. Moreover, if what happens at the macroscopic level supervenes on what happens at the quantum level, then any macroscopic laws must also be compatible with direct divine action.

In the second part of the book (Chapters 5 and 6), Plantinga turns his attention to genuine conflict. Certain claims that evolutionary psychologists make about religion and morality and certain claims that historical biblical critics make about the Bible are obviously incompatible with important Christian beliefs. Is this a science/religion conflict? If Plantinga has any doubts about the scientific credentials of these two disciplines, his arguments in this part of the book are not based on them. Instead, he grants that there are genuine conflicts between science and religion here, but argues for the conclusion that such conflicts are only superficial. He infers this conclusion from the premise that such conflict does not give Christians defeaters for any of their core religious beliefs. In defense of this premise, he claims that the evidence base of Christians is larger than the evidence base to which scientists, because of their methodological naturalism, are restricted. So while the crucial claims made by evolutionary psychologists and historical biblical critics may very well be probable relative to the evidence base to which evolutionary psychologists and historical biblical critics are restricted, those claims are not probable relative to the evidence base of Christians, which includes the alleged deliverances of the sensus divinitatis as well as a host of alleged truths supposedly revealed to Christians in scripture.

Plantinga considers the obvious objection here, which is that this strategy works too well, implying implausibly that Christian beliefs are immune to defeat from science. He denies that his strategy has this implication, claiming that defeat is possible on the grounds that it is possible that scientific evidence for the truth of some proposition (for example, that the earth is round) might, if it is strong enough, lead a Christian to reject an interpretation of scripture (for example, a very literal interpretation of a verse referring to the "four corners of the earth") according to which that proposition is false. Of course, the worry remains that what many Christians take to be the core claims of Christianity could never be defeated in this way. Perhaps that implication, however, does not strike Plantinga as implausible.

An additional concern is that Plantinga's inference from "this conflict does not give (religious) theists a defeater" to "this conflict is superficial" is rather obviously fallacious. Surely a conflict with science can be substantial even if it fails to show that some religious doctrine is improbable relative to what religious believers take their evidence base to be. Why, one wonders, does Plantinga have no interest in the evidential situation of generic theists, agnostics, and atheists? He seems to concede that, relative to their evidence base, genuine conflicts between science and religion do make some of the central doctrines of Christianity improbable. Yet for some reason he believes that his task is complete once he shows that religious believers sufficiently like him don't have defeaters for their core religious beliefs. I believe that Plantinga is the most important philosopher of religion now writing, which I hope suffices to explain why I think he should have a broader focus than is evident here.

Having spent the first two parts (six chapters) of the book defending his first sub-thesis, Plantinga turns in the third and fourth parts to his other three sub-theses. In chapter ten (the only chapter in Part IV), he defends the third and fourth sub-theses (superficial concord and deep conflict between science and naturalism). In chapter nine he defends his second sub-thesis (deep concord between science and theistic religion). This leaves chapters seven and eight disconnected from his thesis as stated. In those chapters, he argues that some design arguments -- and also the discourse about such arguments -- provide non-negligible support for theistic religion. So his thesis really has five sub-theses instead of four, though I'm unsure whether the fifth is that there is concord between science and theistic religion that is neither deep nor superficial or that there is concord between science and theistic religion whose depth is hard to measure.

Plantinga believes that Michael Behe's case for design in Darwin's Black Box, when understood as an attempt to construct a convincing argument for intelligent design, is a failure. His reasons for holding this belief (which are sketched in chapter eight) strike me as extremely strong. He is slightly more optimistic but still skeptical about Behe's case for design in a more recent book, and he argues (in chapter seven) that, while the fine-tuning design argument has more force than its critics are willing to admit, it has much less force than is often attributed to it by its defenders. Clearly, then, the goal here is not to mount a defense of intelligent design theory or even to provide a detailed analysis and evaluation of contemporary design arguments, though Plantinga's critical discussion of these arguments is certainly worth reading.

Instead, his main project in chapters seven and eight is to show how discourse about design can support theism even if no design arguments are sound. He points out that design beliefs are often formed in the basic way instead of by inferring them from other beliefs. It's hard, for example, to read Behe's descriptions of various biochemical machines and not feel any inclination at all to believe they are designed. Does this support theism? If it is assumed that Christian theism is true, then it is likely according to Plantinga that the sensus divinitatis is operating here and that in fact design discourse provides very strong support, not just for intelligent design, but specifically for theism. But even if the sensus divinitatis is not in play, Plantinga thinks that design beliefs resulting from design discourse like Behe's are rational and that evolutionary biology provides only a partial defeater because it has not established the biological possibility of unguided evolution leading to the sorts of biochemical systems Behe discusses. Plantinga concludes that such discourse supports theism, but that it is hard to say how much.

I might be more inclined to agree with this if my exposure to discourse about the nature and history of life on earth were limited to books and articles written by advocates of intelligent design. But when I consider discourse about imperfect design in nature and discourse comparing the extremely slow process leading to biological complexity to the much faster process by which human beings have produced machines of great complexity; when I also take into account the fact that while both human design and natural selection, unlike divine design, involve a trial and error process of "selecting" what works and discarding what doesn't; and when I further consider discourse about the reproductive cycle of the guinea worm and the often grotesque and horrific effects of that cycle on human beings who host that parasite; then I feel an inclination to reject design, and a very strong inclination to reject divine design (i.e., benevolent design supported by power and wisdom limited only by logic). Indeed, I would consider anyone who responds to such discourse by increasing the credence they give to theism to be in a state of suboptimal cognitive health. Notice that I am not defending anargument against theism here -- I'm just talking about what beliefs a rational person should or should not form in the basic way in response to a balanced selection of design and Darwinian discourse.

Philosophers of religion should find chapter nine ("Deep Concord") to be of considerable interest. Plantinga describes in detail a variety of ways in which our cognitive faculties match the world and shows that the possibility or success of science depends on this match. Further, he argues plausibly for the position that, by appealing to the image of God doctrine, theists can account for this match. Naturalists, on the other hand, lack the resources to explain it (evolution is inadequate if not irrelevant here) and so must regard this multi-faceted match, implausibly, as just blind luck. Plantinga draws the provocative conclusion that theism, not naturalism, deserves to be called the "scientific worldview."

The tenth chapter is devoted almost entirely to showing that there is deep conflict between science and naturalism. Here Plantinga reprises (and revises) his well-known evolutionary argument against naturalism. It is important to realize (especially if one is both a naturalist and a dualist of some sort) that he changes his definition of naturalism in this chapter so that it includes materialism about human persons. According to his original definition, naturalism is the view that there is no such person as God or anything like God. Unless "not material" entails "like God," this definition implies that a naturalist can consistently deny materialism about human persons. Why, then, does Plantinga add materialism to his definition of naturalism in this chapter? The key premise of his argument is that the objective probability of our cognitive faculties being reliable given evolution and naturalism is low. This is supposed to give naturalists who believe in evolution a reason to doubt the reliability of their cognitive faculties and so a reason to doubt, not evolution, but the conjunction of evolution and naturalism (hence the alleged deep conflict between science and naturalism). To support this crucial probability claim, Plantinga argues that, if naturalism and materialism were both true, then the only thing relevant to behavior and so to fitness would be a belief's neurophysiological properties. Whether or not the content of a belief is true would be irrelevant, which means that natural selection couldn't favor reliablecognitive faculties. If some form of interactionistic dualism were true, then this sort of reasoning would be unavailable. So Plantinga really shouldn't state his fourth sub-thesis the way he does. The deep conflict he argues for is not between science and naturalism simpliciter; it is between science and the conjunction of naturalism with materialism about human persons.

Chapter ten also includes a very short defense of Plantinga's third sub-thesis that any concord between science and naturalism is superficial. Of course, naturalists routinely assert such concord. Plantinga accuses them of wrapping "themselves in the mantle of science like a politician in the flag" (p. 307). He seems to think, however, that naturalists have no positive arguments for concord, that the best they can do is offer bad arguments for conflict between science and theistic religion and then claim that science has no similar conflicts with naturalism. Two arguments for concord that Plantinga might have considered here are the ones I mentioned earlier, that there is concord between Darwinian evolution and naturalism both because naturalism gives us more reason than theism does to expect Darwinism to be true and because Darwinian evolution helps naturalism account for the facts of evil.

A third argument is ­­­from the success of methodological naturalism. Scientists search only for natural causes of natural phenomena, and time and again natural causes have been found. On the one hand, such success, though compatible with theistic religion, is far from expected. Plantinga (unintentionally) provides support for this point in chapter four, where he argues that, contrary to what Leibniz and many contemporary science and religion writers believe, there are no good theological reasons to believe that an unsurpassably great God would refrain from "intervening" in nature. Of course, Plantinga would claim that the image of God doctrine provides reason to believe that God would not intervene in ways that would make science impossible, but that doesn't rule out God's intervening frequently enough to make methodological naturalism significantly less successful than it has been. If, on the other hand, ontological naturalism is true, then the success of methodological naturalism can be explained at least in part by the fact that there are no supernatural causes of natural phenomena. Whether or not this argument is outweighed or offset or undermined by the fact that the ability to discover causes of any kind requires a match between our cognitive faculties and the world is an interesting question I won't explore here.

One of Plantinga's goals in writing this book was to make it accessible to a broader audience than just specialists in philosophy. It is, of course, difficult for a specialist to judge whether such a goal has been accomplished. I will say this: anyone with no training in philosophy will find chapters seven, nine, and ten to be very challenging, much more challenging, I suspect, than the other chapters. I should add that the writing and argumentation are very clear throughout, and the book is, in my opinion, unusually fun to read. Given the target audience, it is perhaps not surprising that the book does not always dig deeply or broadly enough to fully satisfy specialists in philosophy of religion; but unlike the majority of books on science and religion, it is never philosophically superficial. In fact, in large part because of the importance of the discussion of deep concord in chapter nine and the novelty of the discussion of design discourse in chapter eight, I expect the book to generate considerable secondary literature.[3]

[1] There are several passages in the book that at least suggest skepticism about Darwinism. For example, Plantinga says, "So even if (contrary to fact) either Darwin or more recent biology were to have actually shown that the biological structures in question have come to be by way of these Darwinian mechanisms . . . " (pp. 253-254). Also, Plantinga's skepticism about how frequently and in what ways God might want to act directly in the world, combined with the fact that very few details about the evolutionary histories of organisms and their parts are known, seems to commit him to skepticism about Darwinism.

[2] It is arguable that this was very close to Darwin's own view about how his theory was relevant to the problem of evil, though he doesn't express the point in terms of likelihoods and he compares theism, not to naturalism, but instead to the hypothesis that organisms and their parts are not designed. For more on this, see my "Darwin's Argument from Evil," in Scientific Approaches to the Philosophy of Religion, ed. Yujin Nagasawa (Palgrave Macmillan, 2012), chap. 3.

[3] I am grateful to Daniel Howard-Snyder for very helpful comments on a preliminary draft of this review and to Victor Cosculluela for sending me repulsive but accurate discourse about guinea worms.