Whitehead's Pancreativism: Jamesian Applications

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Michel Weber, Whitehead's Pancreativism: Jamesian Applications, Ontos, 2011, 286pp., $139.95 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381030.

Reviewed by Joseph A. Bracken, S.J., Xavier University


Michel Weber has worked hard to make the philosophy of Alfred North Whitehead better known and appreciated. With Will Desmond, for example, he was the editor of Handbook of Process Thought (Ontos, 2008), which contained 113 entries by 101 scholars from around the globe. Likewise, in the academic series Process Thought, edited by Nicholas Rescher, Johanna Seibt and Weber, Weber published Whitehead's Pancreativism: The Basics in 2006 and now Whitehead's Pancreativism: Jamesian Applications in 2011. As the title indicates, he aims in this book to show the influence of James on Whitehead's intellectual formation and the pertinence of Whitehead's philosophy for understanding James' notion of "radical empiricism". There are some additional chapters setting forth his own thoughts on the value of "radical empiricism" for psychotherapy, economics and politics. In an opening chapter, he explores the specific points where the influence of James on Whitehead was most evident: the epochal theory of time or ontological atomism, the notion of feeling as the bond between successive moments of experience, the denial of the soul as a spiritual substance, and the prerequisite of solitude for religious experience (18-25). Then he contrasts James' celebrated distinction between rationality, irrationality and non-rationality (the priority of life over logic) with Whitehead's reformed subjectivist principle: philosophy starts and ends with experience so that the Universe is constituted by "the interweaving of experiencing subjects and experienced objects." (86). So, while the reflective consciousness found in classical metaphysics tends to be dualistic and substantialistic, radical empiricism is non-dualistic and processive.

In subsequent chapters Weber contrasts James' notion of "pure experience" as the mixture of subjectivity and objectivity with Whitehead's categories of actual entity and society. Actual entities are discontinuous but ordered to one another serially so that there is a flow of feeling from one actual entity to its successor(s) so as to produce a felt continuity (104-113). He likewise makes clear the affinity between James and Whitehead with regard to "first-hand" and "second-hand" religious experiences. First-hand religious experience is private and non-rational; second-hand religious experience is public and rational. First-hand religious experience has to do with spirituality; a feeling-level response to an all-embracing Other; second-hand religious experience has to do with institutional religion and one's participation in its various rituals and doctrinal beliefs. So, while Whitehead and James would agree that "religion is what the individual does with his own solitariness" (Whitehead, Religion in the Making, 16), Whitehead, as a more systematic thinker than James, also sees the value of "rational religion," a system of general truths which have the effect of transforming character when they are sincerely held and vividly apprehended" (Religion in the Making, 15). Weber also takes note of James' belief in a "continuum of cosmic consciousness" in which "subject and object, subject and subject, grow together and reciprocally (com-)prehend themselves" (172). Whitehead, in turn, specified that all actual entities are subject/superjects; thus all entities are both experiencing and experienced, observer and object observed.

In three concluding chapters of his book, Weber ranges farther afield in his espousal of radical empiricism. In the first, he compares the world views of Whitehead and the systemic psychotherapy of Paul Watzlawick. According to Watzlawick, classical psychoanalysis is "first and foremost, monadic, intrapsychic, in its essence: it deals with an isolated individual understood from the general perspective of a school (Freudian, Jungian, Lacanian … )" (189). The analyst tries to understand the deviant behavior of the client in terms of the understanding of the psyche already laid out by Freud, Jung, Lacan, etc. Normally, it takes a long time for the analyst to determine why the client exhibits deviant behavior and then to correct it by attacking its principle or source within the psyche of the client. What Watzlawick called "brief therapy" is "systemic, polyadic. It deals with an interconnected actor from his/her own particular point of view… What matters is the present complaint of the patient, and the rapid reform of the symptoms" (189). It deals with the "how" of a cure here and now rather than the "why" of a problem from a particular scientific perspective. There are thus two different ontologies at work here: "One emphasizes deterministic continuity amid change and linear causation; the other, free change amid continuity and retroactive causation [feedback causation]" (194).

In the next chapter Weber analyzes the relevance of Whitehead's radical empiricism and pragmatic attitude to life ("to live, to live well, to live better" from The Function of Reason). We do not live in a cosmos (a closed or fully determined world) but a chaosmos (an open, only partially ordered world). Yet human beings should still be able to set up a living civilization, grounded in persuasive rather than coercive power, which seeks harmony and relies on a strong sense of the individual-in-community rather than the isolated self-centered individual (214). But unhappily, contemporary Westerners live in a society strongly structured by opposite goals and values, a dystopia rather than a utopia (the dystopia of Aldous Huxley's Brave New World versus the utopia of his later novel Island). Likewise, Weber makes reference to R. D. Laing's The Politics of Experience, which argues for the acceptance of all experiences and only experiences so as not to prejudge the mental health of an individual or of society using a priori concepts. Weber concludes: first, that speculative philosophy like any other scientific discipline should start from experience, not abstract principles; secondly, that generalizations extracted from experience should function to deepen experience; thirdly, that "one should distinguish, but not bring into conflict, the objective and subjective dimensions of experience." (240).

In the final chapter Weber begins with a pair of questions: what is philosophy, and who are philosophers? The answer to the first question is that philosophy functions to naturalize religious myth: "Everything that exists is natural; human beings, the divine, the World form a unified world manifesting the same living power" (249). The answer to the second question is that there are three kinds of philosophers: the living philosopher, the philosopher-expert, and the critical philosopher (249-257). The living philosopher, with William James as the archetypal example, claims that philosophy should assist in living an authentic life. The philosopher-expert is the academic who seeks public recognition by his/her one-sided attack on rival positions. The critical philosopher, exemplified by Whitehead, seeks rational coherence within a philosophy to live by. The way to such a critical philosophy is to admit that, while all experiences have to be taken into account, the most significant do not occur within consciousness-zero or common sense experience. In pure experience, we first experience a felt Whole (Umwelt) and only later experience ourselves as subjects and experience the world as divided into different kinds of objects (267). A lived philosophy emphasizes the felt Whole; analytical philosophy seeks to distinguish between parts and then order them to one another. Radical empiricism demands that both be taken into account:

The philosopher defines for herself the horizon of her questioning, [realizing that] the wider the horizon the more inclusive the thought. But this shouldn't prevent however the philosopher to narrow the scope of his inquiry -- provided that the initial horizon is somehow kept in the background. (274)

An evaluation and critique of this book is not easy to write. On the one hand, while many historians of modern philosophy have tended to align James with Charles Sanders Peirce in terms of pragmatism and an approach to truth-claims in terms of foreseen consequences, Weber tries to explore the affinity of James and Whitehead in terms of radical empiricism with its emphasis on individuality and difference in subjective experience. Many valuable insights into the philosophies of James and Whitehead are thereby gained, but at the price of following a line of thought which is often highly convoluted and hard to follow. This problem is compounded by some obvious inconsistencies in grammar and sometimes an inept choice of words. English is, of course, not Weber's first language; but he or his editor could have engaged the services of a professional proof-reader whose first language is English before publishing the book. Finally, there is no index of topics covered at the end of the book. This is a serious drawback to the utility of an academic publication intended for further scholarly work.

My biggest misgivings with the philosophical conclusions of this book, however, lie elsewhere and may be disputed by Weber and other orthodox Whiteheadians as a misreading of the master's thought. Weber claims that human consciousness is distinguished by continuity amid discontinuity, but his emphasis is on discontinuity, the notion of drops of experience articulated first by James and later adopted by Whitehead, which allows for novelty and creativity. My own preoccupation would be with what is meant by continuity within an ever-changing world. In Whitehead's metaphysics, continuity is provided by the category of society, a succession of actual entities (drops of experience) linked by a flow of feeling (104-113) and a recurrence of pattern or structure in the succession of actual entities (180). For Weber this "contiguity" of feeling and objective pattern between successive actual entities is enough to account for the continuity of existence required by the notion of society; for me that supposition is not explanation enough.

Weber says, for example: "There is a trajectory of actualities-object crowned by an actuality-subject, soon to topple into objectivity and to be followed by a new concrescence" (111). What is this objectivity and where is it located? If one has in mind the consequent nature of God, the moment-by-moment unification of all the newly actualized actual entities in the cosmic process, one should remember that this is, properly speaking, the subjective experience of God as the necessary basis for new divine initial aims to the next generation of actual entities. It corresponds more to the way things should be rather than the way they in fact are. If one rather maintains that past actual entities are objectively present within the extensive continuum as "one relational complex in which all potential objectifications find their niche" (Whitehead, Process and Reality, 66), this begs the question of its place within Whitehead's metaphysical scheme. As something which "underlies the whole world, past, present and future" (Process and Reality, 66), the extensive continuum seems to be related to the divine primordial nature, "the unlimited conceptual realization of the absolute wealth of potentiality" (Process and Reality, 345), but here too one has to ask whether this "relational complex" is part of God's subjective experience or something existing as an objective reality in its own right. Elsewhere in Process and Reality, to be sure, Whitehead refers to the actual world as "a community of entities which are settled actual, and already become" (65). But this statement is ambiguous, given Whitehead's other claim: "In the philosophy of organism it is not 'substance' which is permanent, but 'form.' Forms suffer changing relations; actual entities 'perpetually perish' subjectively, but are immortal objectively" (Process and Reality, 29). So forms survive presumably as the patterns of self-constitution of past actual entities, but once again where are they located: in the subjective experience of God and of newly concrescing finite actual entities, or in the world as an objective reality existing in its own right?

My own solution to this evident ambiguity in Whitehead's metaphysical scheme is to postulate that "societies" are enduring fields of activity or environments structured by the dynamic interrelation of their constituent actual entities from moment to moment. The prevailing structure of the field thereby conditions the concrescence or self-constitution of constituent actual entities from moment to moment, but successive generations of actual entities by their dynamic interrelation alter the structure of the field within which they emerge and to which they contribute their individual pattern of self-constitution before expiring as subjects of experience. So there is an objective reality apart from the subjectivity of God and finite actual entities: namely, the world as a hierarchy of fields within fields, the byproduct or result of the conjoint activity of God and finite actual entities from moment to moment. But, to be fair to Weber, my position is more neo-Whiteheadian than Whiteheadian. Given Whitehead's "reformed subjectivist principle" ("apart from the experience of subjects … there is bare nothingness" [Process and Reality, 167]) and his ontological principle formulated as "no actual entity, then no reason" (Process and Reality, 19), then Weber is a true Whiteheadian and as a result an advocate of radical empiricism, and I am not (at least not without further qualification).