Wilfrid Sellars and the Foundations of Normativity

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Peter Olen, Wilfrid Sellars and the Foundations of Normativity, Palgrave Macmillan, 2016, 240pp., $109.00, ISBN 9781137527165.

Reviewed by Jeremy Randel Koons, Georgetown University in Qatar


There has been little (if any) systematic work on Wilfrid Sellars's early period, or on the relation between his early and mature work. Thus, Peter Olen's book is a welcome contribution to Sellars scholarship, one that not only promotes an understanding of Sellars's early work, but which (by tracing the path from Sellars's early to his mature work) can deepen one's understanding of Sellars's mature philosophy and metaphilosophy.

As Olen notes in this instructive and well-researched work, most Sellars scholars simply treat the ideas and concepts in his early years as continuous with those in his later work. Olen argues that this is a mistake and that by looking at the historical roots of Sellars's early work, we can not only see what a deep influence his Iowa colleagues had on him; we can also see what a profound break his more mature 'behavioristic' work represents from his early formal phase.

From the beginning, Sellars was attempting to chart a via media between rationalism (particularly various forms of Platonism) and empiricism (particularly psychologism). In his earliest works (particularly PPE, ENWW, and RNWW), this attempt took the form of a particularly austere formalism: all philosophical concepts were taken to be purely formal; all factual or descriptive concepts or notions were by definition non-philosophical.

Olen argues persuasively that Sellars's early, radical formalism is a result of a misreading of Carnap -- a misreading he inherits from Bergmann and Hall. This so-called 'Iowa School' misreading attributes to Carnap the view that "meta-linguistic claims cannot reference extra-linguistic objects or properties because they are, by definition, two levels 'above' extra-linguistic referents" (Olen, p. 25). Thus, in a sentence such as "'A' means x," 'x' cannot reference an extra-linguistic reality, due to what Hall calls the 'lingua-centric predicament'. Sellars makes this argument explicitly in a number of his early writings.[1] Driven to this rather extreme formalism, Sellars concludes that the task of philosophy is to construct a 'formal' model of language -- one in which appeal to any factual or psychological notions is strictly off-limits.

Sellars's decisive break with his early pure pragmatics begins by at least 1949, with the publication of LRB, which incorporated explicitly behavioristic (and hence factual) notions to explain rule-governed behavior. There, we can see Sellars already moving away from his early, formal conception of conformation rules toward his more mature conception of rules as implicit in practice and behavior, writing (as Olen points out) that "The mode of existence of a rule is as a generalization written in flesh and blood, or nerve and sinew, rather than in pen and ink . . . [A] rule is an embodied generalization." (LRB, p. 139/¶17). In a more radical departure from pure pragmatics, our conceptual system is tied to the world not through the anemic and experiential 'co-ex' predicate, but through tied behavior, which behavioristically ties responses to the world.

As in Sellars's pure pragmatics, there is still a necessary connection between, or 'meshing' of, the conformation rules and the sentences that play the role of confronting the world (see LRB, p.141/¶21), but there is a much more behavioristic understanding of the confronting sentences. Indeed, Sellars's later philosophy much more radically integrates natural and behavioral elements than pure pragmatics could ever countenance.

This is of more than just historical interest; Olen makes a persuasive case that Sellars's different early- and mid-career metaphilosophies lead to radically different conceptions of important philosophical notions, such as (for example) conformation rules vs. material rules of inference. Many commentators (such as Sicha) simply equate these two notions.[2] And indeed, Sellars does much to encourage this conflation: in LRB, when he has clearly abandoned his early formalism, he continues to speak in terms of conformation rules. Further, CIL (published in 1948), which still contains the formal machinery of his early work, identifies the co-exemplification rules (which is how Sellars long characterized conformation rules) as 'material invariances,' concluding that natural laws can be formulated as 'generalized material implications.' However, as Olen argues, equating the two elides crucial differences between the two, and between the kinds of normativity embodied in each. As Olen points out, conformation rules support only what he calls 'internal normativity.' As Sellars notes at the end of CIL, different sets of conformation rules define different possible worlds, but pure pragmatics does not privilege any world -- there is no distinction between the possible and the actual in pure pragmatics. Hence, no set of conformation rules can be seen as binding as such in pure pragmatics -- only binding relative to a world-story. Thus, their normative bindingness is dependent on a prior choice -- that is, if we choose to adopt this language, then this set of rules is binding on us (just as, say, the axioms of S4 are binding on a logician who chooses to conduct proofs within that system, but not binding in any absolute sense). Further, such a system of norms could be represented purely truth-functionally. Hence, Sellars writes that assuming the perfect language of pure pragmatics (and Sellars's idealized omniscient language user), "It is a direct implication of our argument that the predicate 'true sentence of L' is decidable on purely formal grounds" (RNWW p. 71/§VII/¶44).

But as Olen notes, this internal conception of normativity is not our ordinary conception -- at least not the kind of normativity we care about. "Sellars' later conception of a rule demands recognition from members of a community whether they choose to adopt a rule or not" (Olen, p. 141). Sellars's move to a more robust, 'external' normativity requires a different metaphilosophy.

Readers of Wittgenstein, Brandom, McDowell, Sellars, and others will be familiar with the argument that we cannot make sense of acting under normative constraint in terms of following a rule. Sellars often casts the problem in terms of how one would learn the 'rules' of a language in the first place.[3] Sellars's solution is to argue that the basic cases of conceptual activity -- our language-entry, language-exit, and language-language transitions -- are not actions, not instances of rule-following behavior, but are instead what he calls pattern-governed behavior, which he describes in SRLG as conditioned stimulus-response behavior which can be represented in a metalanguage game by formation and transformation rules which express what the agent would be following if she were obeying rules. The crucial point is that all of these tools for explaining normativity, the relation between language and rules, and so on, are tools that are in principle unavailable to the pure pragmatics of early Sellars. The talk of conditioned responses, the talk of rules as "generalization[s] written in flesh and blood," the role of the community (which I have not discussed, but which should be familiar to scholars of the mature Sellars) -- these represent a melding of the normative and the factual that would not be permitted by Sellars's early formalist metaphilosophy. In this mature phase, mental, intentional, modal, and other sorts of vocabulary are causally reducible but logically irreducible. What does this mean? Consider the following equivalence:

S has mental state M, and M means P ≡ S is in bodily/brain state B

Sellars argues that while the left-hand side of the equivalence may convey what the right-hand side asserts -- specifically, it might convey certain behavioral regularities on the part of B, or that B is in a particular state -- it asserts something that in principle cannot be asserted in purely descriptive language, namely, that M means P. Thus, as Sellars argues, even if the normative is causally reducible to the natural, normative sentences say something that in principle cannot be said in a purely extensional, descriptive language.

In surveying the prospects for Sellars's 'naturalism with a normative turn,' Olen wonders, if empirical psychology can give a complete descriptive account of human behavior, "why philosophical accounts of behavior are needed" (p. 117). Granted, as Olen, notes, Sellars argues that "normative discourse -- especially as it concerns rules -- cannot be reduced to purely extensional terms (in what would be a purely descriptive behavioral language)" and "normative terms must be seen as logically irreducible because their linguistic role cannot be accounted for by descriptive terms" (p. 119), but Olen is left wondering "why we need explanatory resources over and above those found in behavioral psychology" (pp. 119-20). Olen suggests that Sellars's later accounts of normativity face what he calls an 'explanatory gap:' if we can, in principle, explain all of human behavior in terms of descriptive psychology (or other empirical sciences), then what is left to explain by a set of purely philosophical concepts?

Sellars's answer, of course, is that the purpose of philosophical concepts isn't explanation in the first place. For though Sellars (in)famously claims that "in the dimension of describing and explaining the world, science is the measure of all things, of what is that it is, and of what is not that it is not" (EPM p. 173/IX/§41), he is also insistent that the point of modal and normative vocabulary isn't to describe or explain:

Once the tautology 'The world is described by descriptive concepts' is freed from the idea that the business of all non-logical concepts is to describe, the way is clear to an ungrudging recognition that many expressions which empiricists have relegated to second-class citizenship in discourse, are not inferior, just different. (CDCM, p. 282/§79)

Olen thinks that Sellars doesn't give a full answer to the explanatory gap challenge. The problems he sees fall into roughly two categories:

First, if a purely descriptive account fails to capture some aspect of agency -- some aspect that only normative language can capture -- what is the difference between capturing (accounting for, characterizing, etc.) and explaining? In Olen's view, Sellars owes us an answer to this.

Second, while Sellars has solved some of his metaphilosophical problems by meshing philosophical and behavioral concepts, he has sharpened others. If rules are "generalization[s] written in flesh and blood," then aren't philosophical concepts doing explanatory work? And can't this work be done by counterpart scientific or psychological concepts? And in that case, what need is there for a specifically philosophical set of concepts? (This second point is related to what Olen takes to be a general muddying of the distinction between formal and behavioral concepts of behavior in Sellars.)

These are both difficult challenges for Sellars, and we need a story about both points. Olen is right that Sellars cannot consistently say that linguistic rules themselves explain behavior (although Olen has argued that this is precisely what Sellars does argue, for example, in MFC and elsewhere).[4] Ultimately, in response to the second point, Sellars must (and does) argue that the relation between pattern-governed behavior and rules is indirect: trainers train agents (via behavioral reinforcement) to act in accordance with certain ought-to-be's, but this behavior (while rule-conforming) isn't rule-following -- the rules aren't causing the behavior, in an objectionable sense.

As to the first point, I think Sellars can evade the 'explanatory gap' because, as a nominalist, he resists the 'factualizing' move that tries to understand (say) meaning as a relation or thing to be explained descriptively. Rather, as a pragmatist, what Sellars is trying to characterize or account for is what we are doing when we make a moral (or semantic or epistemic or . . . ) claim. Normativity turns out not to be a thing, or a relation, or a property. It is a grammatical mode, and no amount of talking in a descriptive mode will ever amount to making a normative claim. Thus, you can exhaustively describe the behavior of people acting under a set of rules and normative constraints. But the type of normativity in question here would be akin to Olen's 'internal' normativity: in describing it, we would not undertake any of the described normative commitments. To undertake a commitment, we must leave the descriptive mode and enter a different mode -- and hence do something that is not captured by (descriptive) explanation, but which does not thereby create an explanatory gap.

I can't pretend that this brief sketch has responded to Olen's concerns. These are deep issues he has raised about Sellars's later philosophy, and it is an open question as to whether the full story can succeed. (And frankly, while I am sanguine about Sellars's expressivism about normativity, I think his thesis of 'causal reducibility' is a non-starter, at least in the strong form in which Sellars states it.) But in any case, Olen's book leads us to a more profound understanding of both Sellars's early and mature philosophy; critical inquiry can then proceed from this more profound understanding.

There are also places where, I think, Olen overstates the degree to which the formal nature of Sellars's early metaphilosophy constrains Sellars's pure pragmatics. For example, Sellars argues that an empirically adequate language would necessarily contain various 'conformation rules,' which Olen says would restrict "the possible combinations of expressions with other expressions" and represent "the relationship between, and permissible or impermissible order of, individual constants in a language, as well as restrict the possible combination of non-relational predicates and individual constants in a formal language" (p. 49). Olen, however, asks "how can the necessary inclusion of material requirements be a non-factual concept?" (p. 52) Certainly, all observed languages do have such restrictions, but this is an empirical fact, and, in any case, this is not the sort of necessity that interests Sellars. I think, though, that Sellars has an a priori argument (briefly presented in RNWW, and at length in CIL) for the necessity of conformation rules in any language: if there were no conformation rules restricting the co-exemplification of predicates, then all predicates would be empty of content, and hence we would have no predicates at all. Thus, while the precise content of conformation rules is a factual matter, it is an a priori truth that any array of particulars which is to count as a possible world must conform to some set of conformation rules. As Sellars himself puts the point, "the statement, that certain synthetic universal sentences are true of the world, is itself analytic" (ENWW p. 37/§II/¶13).

But there is not much to be gained by defending Sellars's earliest work at great length. While, as Olen notes, there is much in Sellars's early philosophy that is recognizable in his middle philosophy, the project of pure pragmatics simply cannot accomplish what it needs to do, given the self-imposed restrictions on available tools. Olen is surely correct about this; and he is also surely correct that it is imperative that we recognize Sellars's early metaphilosophy as a different -- and far less promising -- project than his mature work. It is here, again, that the real strength of Olen's work lies, and he offers a sustained and convincing critique of interpreters like Brandom who attempt an 'internalist' reading of Sellars (trying to read Sellars's entire philosophical corpus as consistent and continuous), or who otherwise read the project in an ahistorical way. Given the narrative outlined above of how Sellars's thinking developed -- and the very different metaphilosophies which Olen argues are at work in Sellars's early and mature work -- internalist and ahistorical readings simply are not plausible.

The last 60 or so pages of the book contain previously unpublished correspondence between Sellars and a number of interlocutors, as well as an unpublished manuscript fragment, "Psychologism." The latter is interesting in that one can see, in nascent form, some of the ideas that will take more mature form in LRB. The paper is an interesting historical document in the intellectual history of Sellars, as he moves from his early formalism into his later, behavioristically-influenced naturalism.

Much (though not all) of the correspondence, dating from 1946 to 1953, is between Sellars and various Iowa colleagues. In these early letters, Sellars expresses often his debt to these colleagues, writing to Bergmann (for example), "I have often told you I regard you as one of the most important of contemporary philosophers. . . I look to you [because of] the obvious influence you have had on my thinking" (pp. 179 and 181). In return, his correspondents subject Sellars's early work to forceful (and sometimes withering) criticism, not only for its stylistic difficulty, but often for its substance, as well. Particularly interesting in this regard are the very detailed letters from Thomas Storer (Nebraska) and Rulon Wells (Yale) toward the end of the collection, which raise some fundamental difficulties for Sellars's pure pragmatics. Wells, for example, writes that:

You say that 'a rule is always a rule for doing something.' The reference here to biological and indeed human activity could not escape the most casual reader; now this reference is bound to make trouble for pure pragmatics, which knows not human beings nor even is committed to a temporal world of acts and active beings (p. 216).

One can only suspect that the criticisms of Sellars's correspondents were largely responsible for his abandonment of pure pragmatics. If so, this demonstrates again the profound influence of the 'Iowa school' (and of some of Sellars's non-Iowa colleagues) on Sellars's thought, and the importance of situating historically this great figure of 20th-century American philosophy.


CDCM: "Counterfactuals, Dispositions, and the Causal Modalities," in H. Feigl, M. Scriven and G. Maxwell (eds.), Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Vol. II (University of Minnesota Press, 1957), pp. 225-308.

CIL: "Concepts as Involving Laws and Inconceivable Without Them," in PPPW, pp. 95-123.

ENWW: "Epistemology and the New Way of Words," in PPPW, pp. 31-46.

EPM: "Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind," in SPR, pp. 127-196.

LRB: "Language, Rules, and Behavior," in PPPW, pp. 129-155.

MFC: "Meaning as Functional Classification," Synthese 27:3/4 (July-August 1974), pp. 417-437.

PPE: "Pure Pragmatics and Epistemology," in PPPW, pp. 5-26.

PPPW: Pure Pragmatics and Possible Worlds: The Early Essays of Wilfrid Sellars, J. Sicha (ed.) (Ridgeview Publishing Company, 1980).

RNWW: "Realism and the New Way of Words," in PPPW, pp. 53-85.

SPR: Science, Perception and Reality (Ridgeview Publishing Company, 1963).

SRLG: "Some Reflections on Language Games," in SPR, pp. 321-358.

[1] See, for example, PPE (pp. 22-23/§4/¶¶40-41) and RNWW (p. 60/§IV/¶16).

[2] See, e.g., Sicha, Introduction to PPPW, p. xxxi/¶64).

[3] See, for example, SROLG ('Introductory,' p. 321/¶1).

[4] Olen, personal correspondence.