Wilfrid Sellars and Twentieth-Century Philosophy

Wilfrid Sellars And Twentieth Century Philosophy

Stefan Brandt and Anke Breunig (eds.), Wilfrid Sellars and Twentieth-Century Philosophy, Routledge, 2020, 245pp., $160.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780815384991.

Reviewed by Luca Corti, University of Padua


The sheer number of studies on Wilfrid Sellars that have mushroomed in recent years are an unequivocal sign that he has acquired canonic status in contemporary debates (cf. Seiberth forthcoming, Garfield 2018, Koons 2018, Corti-Nunziante 2018, Pereplyotchik and Barnbaum 2017, Gironi 2017, O'Shea 2016, Reider 2016, Olen 2016). Despite this uptick in interest, however, the terrain is still fertile for innovative work, and this volume, edited by Stefan Brandt and Anke Breunig, makes an important contribution in mapping the terrain and exploring Sellars' "historical role in twentieth century philosophy" (2). This evaluation unfolds through three overlapping conceptual lines: Part I tracks a set of influences on Sellars' thought and illuminates the origin of some of his views; Part II explores Sellars' position in relation to other twentieth century philosophical traditions (not only "Analytic philosophy", as the section title suggests, but also pragmatism and some transcendental philosophy); and Part III puts Sellars' insights into dialogue with contemporary scholarship, in order to highlight a set of lessons that can be drawn from his thought (on inference, truth, self-knowledge) and to raise some points of criticism.

In the first chapter, Boris Branhdoff reconstructs a "largely unknown line of reception" (12) that connects Sellars' views to the philosophy of John Cook Wilson, the founding father of Oxford realism. During his years at Oxford (1934-1937), Sellars remarked that he considered Wilson's book Statement and Inference to be "the philosophical book of the century" (Sellars 1957 §1: 458). Brandhoff takes this claim seriously and, supporting it with other evidence, highlights a series of analogies between Sellars' and Wilson's "metaphilosophical and methodological commitments." In particular, he highlights how conceiving of philosophy as an enterprise that "takes ordinary linguistic usage as [the] point of departure, carefully exploring the distinctions inherent in everyday usage" (16) is something that links Wilson not only to his philosophical grandchild, Gilbert Ryle, but also to Sellars. Unlike other branches of Sellarsian interpretation (cf. Olen 2016), Brandhoff sees a continuous line of Wilson-inspired metaphilosophy traversing Sellars' career (22) that is rooted in an idea of philosophy as making explicit the norms that functionally constitute the "way in which we conceive ourselves and the world we live in" (24). This essay can be seen as crucially intervening in a broader narrative about Sellars' influences: we cannot definitively exclude, however, that Sellars may have absorbed some of the views Brandhoff traces back to Wilson via other sources -- such as Ryle himself, for instance, or Sellars' own father, R.W. Sellars (Gironi 2018), from whom Wilfrid inherited the appreciation for natural science that clearly set him apart "from Ryle and Strawson" (24).

Breunig instead closely investigates the relationship between Sellars and Carnap (thus expanding the work of scholars such as Gabbani 2018, Olen 2016, Carus 2004). Breunig claims that Sellars' criticism of Carnap pivots on the notion that the latter "should recognize the normative character of linguistic rules" (31) -- a thesis Breunig contends is not merely the product of a misreading typical of the Iowa School (i.e., formulated by Bergmann and Hall, then absorbed by Sellars, cf. Olen 2016), but actually has some legitimate grounding in Carnap's text. Breunig identifies three problems internal to Carnap's view of empirical meaning that might motivate Sellars to develop a normative account. Although these criticisms are not explicitly articulated by Sellars (historically, this might be a weak point of the chapter), they do logically motivate the development of some of Sellars' philosophical views.

Peter Olen's chapter attempts to expand the horizon of influences on Sellars in order to include the Polish logician and philosopher Kazimierz Ajdukiewicz. Olen contends that Sellars "appropriates Ajdukiewicz's notion of a world-perspective in his early works" (56), which later becomes Sellars' notion of "world story" and is connected to that of "picturing". In Ajdukiewicz's thought, the notion of "world-perspective" is tied to the idea that language embodies a certain interpretation of the world whose truth or falsehood is not assessable in absolute terms, i.e., from a point of view outside of the specific language in which it is uttered (59). Olen maintains that Sellars' appropriation of this idea is almost direct, since his "definition of world-story plays the exact same role as Ajdukiewicz's world-perspective" (64) and both use notions "in the exact same way" (66). Olen aims to defend a claim of strong influence, not simple inspiration: a "direct historical relationship between the two philosophers" (66). Notably, Olen notes that the notion of world-story does not disappear in what he refers to as Sellars' shift between earlier and later metaphilosophies; he shows how the role of this idea changed over time and insightfully outlines its philosophical significance.

In the last chapter devoted to "influences," Brandt carefully reconstructs and compares Sellars' and Wittgenstein's views on the problem of "following a rule". After providing some philological evidence that a few related Sellarsian insights were inspired by Wittgenstein (i.e., sections on "rule following" are the most heavily underlined parts in Sellars' copy of Wittgenstein's Investigations), Brandt argues that Wittgenstein and Sellars are interested in "two different questions" (86): Sellars in the question of "how can I act because of a certain rule despite the fact that this rule does not explicitly figure in my thinking", Wittgenstein in the question of "how a rule can determine its own application" (86). Brandt argues against reading Wittgenstein as defending the claim that rules are implicit in practice (the elephant in the room here is Robert Brandom's reading of the Investigations) and instead attributes to Wittgenstein the more minimalist claim that there needs to be a practice (reminiscent of McDowell 2009). For Brandt, Sellars' notion of rule following maintains that such behavior requires mental representation of the followed rule (88), but this is not the case for Wittgenstein.

This first part of the volume very productively expands the current state of research about Sellars' reception of logical positivism. Yet some important figures are missing -- Sellars' fundamental relation to Herbert Feigl and especially to Gustav Bergmann remain unexplored (on Feigl, cf. Neuber 2017) -- leaving room for further inquiry.

Part II, "Sellars and the Analytic Tradition," contains three essays. The first two respectively address the general questions 'was Sellars an analytic philosopher?' (Szubka) and 'was he a pragmatist? (O'Shea). The third essay offers a particular reading of Sellars as developing a transcendental account of perceptual warrant (Haag).

Tadeusz Szubka addresses the issue of Sellars' status as an analytic philosopher by analyzing his metaphilosophical views. Szubka notes a shift in Sellars' thought from an early understanding of philosophy, typical of analytic philosophy, as a clarificatory enterprise that does not produce substantive knowledge but instead eliminates confusions, (102) to a later, broader claim that tasks philosophy with "clarification of the logical structure -- in the broadest sense -- of discourse" (104). For Szubka, this means that Sellars implicitly cedes the 'no substantive knowledge' thesis and that his own statements to the contrary represent "undue modesty" (105).

Aside from the labelling issue (the question of whether Sellars is "analytic" or "non-analytic" has little informative value in and of itself), this reconstruction helps us to trace the general coordinates of Sellars' inquiry. Yet Szubka's metaphilosophical analysis represents a starting point for a much larger discussion and needs to be further complicated, especially by deeper investigation of Sellars' claims that philosophical problems need to be solved in terms of conceptual frameworks (Sellars 1963, 60) approached through the construction of models and creation of a model of all models (Sellars 1975, 4), and his notions of transcendental method (cf. Haag in this volume) and of the expressive role of philosophical propositions (Christias 2014). Such aspects of his thought are more difficult to analyze according to an analytic/non-analytic binary opposition and point to Sellars' unique standpoint, opening up some interesting lines of further inquiry.

James R. O'Shea instead addresses the question "How pragmatist was Sellars"? His answer is that "Sellars' philosophy . . . was deeply pragmatist both in its motivation and its content, whether considered conceptually, historically or in his own estimation" (110). O'Shea first dispels the myth of Sellars' hostility to pragmatism by highlighting his explicit acknowledgment of pragmatist affinities with C.I. Lewis (and Dewey), as well as by pointing to Sellars' reception of some pragmatist-friendly views inherited from his father. O'Shea then focuses on pragmatist themes key to Sellars' own thinking, especially his functional understanding of concepts and conceptual content and conception of truth as S-assertiblity (also discussed by Shapiro in this volume), which constitute deeply pragmatist, anti-Cartesian, and anti-platonic commitments.

Johannes Haag reconstructs Sellars' conception of perceptual warrant and argues against John McDowell's (2016) claim that Sellars' view has a blind spot. In doing so, Haag adds another layer to his overall account of Sellars' epistemology of perception as part of a larger "transcendental project" (134, cf. Haag 2007). For Haag, Sellars aims to offer an understanding of the conceptual framework necessary for us to be finite perceivers. In this context, perceptual beliefs take the standard form of thinking-out-loud statements like "Lo! Here is a red apple" (Sellars 1975: 325; Haag makes a further distinction between this belief and perceptual takings, which I will not consider here). According to Haag, in standard cases, when no countervailing conditions obtain, perceptual belief is conclusively warranted -- with conclusive here being used in precisely McDowell's required sense. Therefore "Sellars conceives of experience itself as a case of direct, non-inferential (perceptual) knowledge" (137). Yet Sellars' account involves the possibility of challenging this warrant, a possibility grounded in the constitutive fallibility of our perceptual capacities. For Haag, however, the burden falls on the challenger to prove that perceptual capacities are malfunctioning. What happens when they are adequately able to do so? Haag argues that in such cases we move from one level of discourse to a categorically different, "higher-order level" of justification. The original statement needing justification is no longer used but rather mentioned in the context of a "trans-level inference", as we rise to an evaluative level "that states its epistemic warrant" (137). Haag defends this Sellarsian strategy according to which our perceptual capacities are innocent until proven guilty as sympathetic to McDowell's account; but his reconstruction transfers the burden of proof onto the notion of trans-level inference, which needs to be spelled out in a coherent way in order to show that the move to a "higher-level" plays its purported justificatory role. Haag's essay (together with his 2014) constitutes a first gesture in this direction.

Part III of the volume is titled "Learning from Sellars" and aims to engage with Sellars' work "by either criticizing or building on it" (5). In this section, Johannes Hübner insightfully shows how Sellars' distinction between rules of criticism and rules of action can be brought to bear on current discussions of inference, especially as formulated by Paul Boghossian. In particular, he shows how Sellars' idea of the rules of criticism sidesteps the problems related to conceiving of inference as an action and provides a conception of rule-following combined with "subtle dispositional analysis" (168).

Lionel Shapiro's careful analysis tracks the evolution of Sellars' views on truth and shows that, starting in 1963, Sellars came to embrace truth pluralism and relativism by developing an analysis of truth as S-assertibility (179). This has "devastating" (185) consequences on his account for Shapiro, since pragmatic accounts are not able to ground inferences such as "That snow is white is true ↔ snow is white" (182). For Shapiro, both truth pluralism and truth relativism emerge from Sellars' interest in the possibility of progress among conceptual frameworks and need to account for a plurality of conceptual structures.

Willem A. deVries' short and sharp essay points to three potential criticisms of Sellars' thought. One is Sellars' ambiguous use of the phrase "immediate experience": sometimes he seems to use it to refer to "nonconceptual elements in experience", other times to refer to "nonconceptual experiences" or episodes. Another problematic aspect is Sellars' famous claim that some (if not all) cases of perception involve "mistaking" a sensory state in ourselves for an aspect of a physical object. This idea, deVries notices, is present in Sellars (1982) but not in his contemporary work (1978). DeVries shows that this view is hard to defend, since it makes it difficult, if not impossible, "to see why we have or even how we could have the success in cognition and action that we have" (215). The third, more minor point, concerns the predominance of the visual paradigm in Sellars' account of perceptual properties, which leads him to understand sensibles of touch (e.g., coolness) as having a special status in perception with respect to other visible properties, since it is neither properly seen nor believed. Things seem less complicated than that in fact, for deVries, since coolness is a proper sensible of touch. Disentangling such thorny issues is crucial for any coherent scholarly reconstruction of Sellars' thought.

The final essay by Franz Knappik addresses Sellars' account of self-knowledge, clarifying Sellars' attempts to defend a distinctively first-person kind of access to thinking without falling into the Myth of the Given. Such a position involves several steps, and Knappik reconstructs them carefully: after introducing thought as a theoretical concept developed by the genius Jones, Sellars explains self-reporting as established through a training in which the trainee has no access to her own manifest behavioral symptoms -- s(he) "cannot observe these symptoms" -- but the trainer can and can reward her accordingly (224). If the training succeeds, a causal link is established. Knappik notes that a further step is then needed to establish the authority of such self-knowledge (why should I have a direct warrant on my thoughts?). To show this, Knappik appeals to trans-level inferences (in the same way Haag did for perception) in an attempt to eschew typical criticisms of causal accounts of self-knowledge (228). Knappik shows how Sellars could defend his view against the objection that thoughts should be "phenomenally conscious" (233) and argues that Sellars should integrate this view into his account rather than reject it (235).

In sum, Brandt and Breunig have succeeded in putting together a variegated and solid collection, which constitutes a useful addition to our ongoing scholarly engagement with Sellars. The volume makes an important contribution to the project of obtaining a synoptic view of his thought, both from a historical and philosophical point of view, and will certainly encourage further research in the field.


Carus, A.W. 2004. "Sellars, Carnap, and the Logical Space of Reasons". In: Awodey S., Klein C. (eds.). Carnap Brought Home: The View From Jena. Chicago: Open Court.

Christias, D. 2014. "An Interpretation and Extension of Sellars's Views on the Epistemic Status of Philosophical Propositions". Metaphilosophy 45: 348-371.

Corti, L. and Nunziante, A. 2018. Sellars and the History of Modern Philosophy. New York: Routledge.

Gabbani, C. 2018. "Sellars and Carnap: Science and/or Metaphysics". In Corti-Nunziante 2018: 197-215.

Garfield, J. L. 2018. Wilfrid Sellars and Buddhist Philosophy: Freedom from Foundations. New York: Routledge.

Gironi, F. 2017. The Legacy of Kant in Sellars and Meillassoux: Analytic and Continental Kantianism. New York: Routledge.

Haag, J. 2007. Erfahrung und Gegenstand. Das Verhältnis von Sinnlichkeit und Verstand. Frankfurt: Klostermann.

Haag, J. 2014. "McDowells Kant und McDowells Sellars". In Barth, C. & Lauer, D. (eds.). Die Philosophie John McDowells. Paderborn: mentis. 145-168.

Koons, J.R. 2018. The Ethics of Wilfrid Sellars. New York: Routledge.

McDowell, J. 2009. "How Not to Read Philosophical Investigations: Brandom's Wittgenstein". In The Engaged Intellect. Cambridge: Harvard University Press. 96-111.

Neuber, M. 2017. "Feigl, Sellars, and the Idea of a 'Pure Pragmatics'''. In Pihlström, S., Stadler, F., and Weidtmann, N. Logical Empiricism and Pragmatism. New York: Springer.

O'Shea, J. R. 2016. Sellars and His Legacy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Olen, P. 2016. Wilfrid Sellars and the Foundations of Normativity. London: Palgrave Macmillan.

Pereplyotchik, D. and Barnbaum, D.R. (eds.) 2017. Sellars and Contemporary Philosophy. New York: Routledge.

Reider, P. J. (ed.) 2016. Wilfrid Sellars, Idealism, and Realism: Understanding Psychological Nominalism. London and New York: Bloomsbury.

Seiberth, L.C. forthcoming. Intentionality in Sellars: A Transcendental Account of Finite Knowledge. New York, Routledge.

Sellars, W. 1957. "Logical Subjects and Physical Objects". Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 17: 458-72.

Sellars, W. 1963. "Phenomenalism". In Science, Perception and Reality. 60-105. Atascadero: Ridgeview.

Sellars, W. 1975. "The Structure of Knowledge: (1) Perception; (2) Minds; (3) Epistemic Principles". In H-N Castaneda (ed.). Action, Knowledge and Reality: Studies in Honor of Wilfrid Sellars. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill. 295-347.

Sellars, W. 1978. "Some Reflections on Perceptual Consciousness". In Crosscurrents in Phenomenology. R. Bruzina and B.Wilshire (eds.) Dordrecht: Kluwer. 169-185.

Sellars, W. 1982. "Sensa or Sensings: Reflections on the Ontology of Perception". Philosophical Studies 41(1): 83-111.